Philosophy, Technology, and the Environment

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David M. Kaplan, ed., Philosophy, Technology, and the Environment, MIT Press, 2017, ix + 255 pp., $30.00 (pbk), ISBN 9780262533164

Reviewed by Steven Vogel, Denison University


The important and indeed admirable idea motivating this anthology is that environmental philosophy and the philosophy of technology, two fields that in recent decades have made significant strides, have much in common and ought to be more in conversation with each other than has generally been the case. Yet this collection is a bit of a disappointment, impressive more in its ambition than its carry-through, and leaves one wishing for a deeper investigation of the relationship between the two fields, beginning with more of a serious attempt to define what they actually are and what the connection is between the objects with which they claim to concern themselves.

The trouble starts early, in the first paragraph of the Introduction, when editor David Kaplan writes that "Environmental issues inevitably involve technology, and technologies inevitably have environmental impacts. Technology and the environment are like two sides of the same coin" (1). But baseball games inevitably involve pitching, and pitching inevitably has impacts on baseball games, yet it doesn't follow from this that baseball and pitching are two sides of the same coin. Rather the latter is subsumed under the former; the possibility that this is the relationship between environmental philosophy and philosophy of technology, or for that matter that each is an aspect of some third field, is never really considered in the articles here. Instead most seem to presuppose a fundamental dualism whereby "environment" (which means "nature") is distinguished from "technology," the former referring to a world prior to and unsullied by human doings, the latter to a built world generated by exactly such doings, with the overlapping subject matter studied by the two fields understood as the impact of these distinct worlds upon each other, focusing on the way technologies affect (and harm) nature on the one hand, and the way nature constrains (causally and normatively) those technologies on the other.

Such a dualism treats humans as outside of nature, and thus assumes from the start that human actions (and technologies) are un- or even anti-natural -- a claim that few authors within either field would explicitly accept, and that indeed many explicitly deny, but that nonetheless seems paradoxically central to the way many talk about the issues they investigate. Yet the "environment" most of us inhabit is a pretty thoroughly technological one, while on the other hand the capacity to build technologies seems just as natural to humans as that of honeybees to build hives, which seems to suggest that philosophical investigation of the environment, of nature, and of technology are all concerned with the same thing, and that one of the first questions such an investigation might ask is why we think those things are different, even if only in the sense of being "two sides of the same coin." None of the essays in this collection consider this sort of question, which strikes me as the key one that a self-aware confrontation between environmental philosophy and philosophy of technology ought to examine. Still, a number of potentially interesting issues are raised, and I'll briefly discuss each of the essays, grouping some together that have similar themes.

The first two are by J. Baird Callicott and Don Ihde, each a crucial and even foundational figure in the two respective fields. Each article is interesting but, frankly, each also gives the distinct impression of having been quickly tossed off. Callicott criticizes a tendency among environmental philosophers, beginning with Lynn White's famous argument linking environmental problems to Genesis's ascription to humans of a divinely ordained dominion over nature, to attribute environmental difficulties to modes of thought -- a tendency that, as he notes makes the solution to those difficulties look like merely a matter of developing new ways of thinking, thus (surprise!) giving philosophers a key role in environmentalism. Against this intellectual determinism Callicott contrasts a "technological determinism" (which he points out White actually defended in other work) that puts much less emphasis on the power of ideas and more on the way that technologies themselves affect our understandings of the world. This line of argument is a valuable one, but after that the essay seems to run out of steam, first proposing a vaguely interactionist conception of the relation between ideas and technologies that still seems to give pride of place to ideas, and then ending rather abruptly with some speculations on how digital technologies may be changing worldviews and the suggestion that, rather than philosophers, it is people such as Steve Jobs who will have the most impact on responding to environmental challenges. Ihde's article is similarly suggestive but undeveloped, offering a series of critiques of the tendency towards dystopianism endemic to both the philosophy of technology and environmental philosophy, but without providing any sustained reflection on the connections between those fields. He ends with a vague optimism that certain environmental problems will be amenable to technological solutions, calling for small and incremental advances to improve environmental quality and suggesting the importance of philosophers playing a role in early research and development of technologies. He concludes by writing that "I want to indicate that all enviro-technological problems are complex, ambiguous, and interwoven" (38), which is doubtless true enough but doesn't offer much in the way of fresh insight.

In their more substantive contribution, Kyle Powys Whyte, Ryan Gunderson, and Brett Clarke examine the idea of the "insidiousness" of technology, one they find common in both fields investigated here, and contrast it to a view of technology as a fundamentally neutral tool helpful for solving environmental problems. But when they define insidiousness as "the idea that communities that adopt technological hardware, such as televisions, or rely on technological supply chains, such as global agri-food, cannot stop the erosion of their previous, more intimate relations with the environment" (41), it seems to me that they conflate two distinct theses. The claim that technology is not a value-free tool for satisfying (ahistorical) human interests is separate from the claim that using it damages prior and "more intimate" relations to the environment, but the authors do not draw that distinction. And even with respect to the first claim they seem to understand it in the intellectually deterministic way that Callicott's essay objects to, writing, for instance (ironically in a discussion of Callicott's work on the Ojibway), that "technology is inevitably associated with the dominant worldviews [my emphasis] of the society that created that particular technology" (49) and using this to criticize the impact on indigenous communities of the introduction of foreign technologies. "Store-bought items," they suggest, "in some way contain the ideas and values of the society that produced them within their very substance"; when used in a different society, they write, "the substance of the goods -- i.e., the lifeways of another society -- becomes an integral part of the interaction" (49). But to identify technology with a worldview, or the "substance" of a commodity with a "lifeway," is to fall prey to the very idealism that Callicott warned against: technologies are primarily forms of practice, not expressions of ideals or values. This idealism leads to trouble at the end of the essay when the authors turn to Marx, arguing that the problem has to do with capitalism and with technologies that "are often developed to service the interest of those in power" (54); what's missing in such a remark is the insight that capitalism and capitalist technologies make possible and produce those interests -- again, that it is technology as a material force, not as expression of a worldview, that makes it "insidious."

Paul Thompson's essay examines "resistance to risky technology" (going back to Ned Ludd), and offers a nuanced discussion of the phenomenon of "social amplification of risk" in which citizens perceive and object to risks to technologies that "rational" scientific assessments fail to confirm. Sometimes, Thompson points out, this is because those assessments consider only certain sorts of risks -- for instance, the biological ones associated with new bio- or agro-technologies -- and not (as in the Luddite example) the social, cultural, or economic consequences that those technologies might put into play. Other times, though, such resistance may result from familiar "irrational" cognitive biases or heuristics (loss-aversion, anchoring, etc.). But even the latter, he points out, may have a normative significance -- first, interestingly, because the widespread existence of such biases might suggest them to have had an evolutionary benefit, but secondly also because a commitment to democratic decision-making might mean that expert views, no matter how putatively rational, don't trump the authentically held concerns of citizens. This is especially so, he points out, when some groups of citizens are subject to deep injustices of various kinds: in such cases concerns about risk may also express "wisdom gained from experience with . . . the deceptions of wealthy and well-placed actors who have persistently benefited at the expense of the less powerful and less fortunate majority." Scientific risk assessment, he concludes, must be accompanied with a commitment to "effective responses to injustice on the ground" (77).

Ben Hale's "Getting the Bad Out" is the most philosophically substantial contribution to the volume. He examines the question of remediation of environmental harms, providing a number of intuition pumps, ranging from considering the responsibility of airplane passengers to clean up after themselves despite knowing that a cleaning crew is coming in to the question of whether the discovery of a compound emitted by the lava flowing from a volcanic eruption that could counteract a factory's polluting emissions might justify drilling holes in the lava to increase the amount of the compound entering the atmosphere. The trouble with intuition pumps (especially as they get more complicated) is that sometimes the reader just doesn't share the asserted intuitions. Hale seems to think that adding a material to a pollutant within a smokestack to render it harmless when emitted is morally permissible, but emitting the same material from the smokestack to counteract the pollutant in the atmosphere is not, and I found myself hesitant to agree: the "intuition" here depends on a some kind of private/public distinction that requires more discussion. More problematic still is his intuition that a remediation that returns a bad situation back to its original state is morally preferable to one that produces a new state, even if that new state is no worse than the original one, an idea that he uses to support carbon-scrubbing geoengineering technologies over stratospheric sulfur injection. Even if the intuition here were valid (I'm not sure it is) it seems moot: time's arrow guarantees that no modification of the world ever returns it to an earlier state. Our actions in the world always change it -- which is one of the reasons that an environmentalism that wants us to protect "nature" in the sense of the non-human world has to be a non-starter, since anything humans do to protect it also inevitably alters it. Hale's other point, which I find more congenial, is that the permissibility of various remediation activities ultimately depends on their acceptability to all parties affected (and thus may not be merely a private matter), although he's somewhat cagey about who those parties are (at one point including living and non-living beings in the list -- does that include refrigerators?). I wish he had said more about that last point; as it is, it remains frustratingly undeveloped in the essay.

Some of the later articles in the book are less interesting, and arguably less philosophical. Clare Heyward, Steve Rayner, and Julian Savulescu give a clear account of the proposed Oxford Principles for governance of geoengineering projects, emphasizing the procedural character of those principles and contrasting them to the more substantive principles proposed by Dale Jamieson and others. The essays by Ibo van de Poel, Braden Allenby, and Zhang Wei all deal with various conceptions of "eco-design," and would seem more in place in a volume on environmental engineering and design. Wei's discussion is perhaps the most philosophically interesting; it criticizes a design approach that "pays too much attention to the environmental effects of the products themselves but seldom cares for the possible impacts on the behaviors of the users" and uses some ideas from Peter-Paul Verbeek to discuss the way in which design itself can serve a "persuasive" function, encouraging users into more environmentally positive behavior. Philip Brey discusses the role of technology in helping achieve sustainability, but doesn't have much new or insightful to say about it beyond the familiar warnings that technology isn't neutral and that economic growth doesn't necessarily produce happiness.

Mark Sagoff's contribution "Do We Consume Too Much?" begins with a very strong criticism of the tendency towards apocalypticism among some environmentalists, whose repeated (and repeatedly falsified) predictions of doom are based on Malthusian and similar arguments he persuasively rebuts. "The idea that increased consumption will inevitably lead to depletion and scarcity," he writes, "is mistaken both in principle and in fact" (175). Yet his is not at all a naïve techno-optimism. Rather he argues that the reasons to question the hyper-consumption that technology makes possible are ethical and religious, not Malthusian: "Even if technology overcomes the physical limits nature sets on the amount we can produce and consume, however, there are moral, spiritual, and cultural limits to growth" (186). The best arguments for protecting nature, he suggests, are aesthetic and moral ones, focusing on nature's intrinsic value and not its economic significance. The essay ends too quickly, but the ideas Sagoff presents are valuable ones.

The two final essays, by Raymond Anthony and Wyatt Galusky, both apply the notion of the non-neutrality of technology to the question of animal agriculture. Anthony points out that large-scale industrial food production treats animals as anonymous commodities possessing technical properties but lacks the sort of concern for the animals' own natures characteristic of traditional pre-modern agriculture. Indeed, "technological commodification" changes the very natures of the animals themselves, breeding them for traits that make them easier and more profitable to handle. He calls for an "environmental virtue ethic of care" that intends "to reinstitute the subjectivity of animals as part of reinvigorating our moral relationship with food" (218). The account faces some of the usual difficulties of a virtue ethics, though: the claim that human excellence requires treating animals with respect, although plausible enough, isn't argued for, and the socio-economic structures that might prevent the proposed virtues from being developed are scarcely mentioned. Galusky raises the question of whether in vitro meat might serve as a magic bullet overcoming the evils of current animal agriculture, and argues that on the contrary such a further technologization of meat production represents a "doubling down" on an approach to the natural world that simplifies and homogenizes it in order to place it under human control. Such an approach views nature as merely something available for human purposes, reducing animals to things we can use and for which we are responsible while stripping them of an "otherness" from which we can learn. Our experience of the world is thereby impoverished, Galusky argues, and ultimately we too are "simplified." The influence in these arguments of figures such as Albert Borgmann and Heidegger is clear.

In summary: some of the essays here offer interesting discussions of various issues involving the human relationship to the environment that humans inhabit -- a topic that one might call "environmental philosophy" or "philosophy of technology" or both. A better name, I might suggest, would be something like political epistemology, meaning the normative study of the practices through which humans inhabit and understand the world: I wish there had been more direct examination in the volume of the deeper questions such a topic suggests.