Philosophy Within Its Proper Bounds

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Edouard Machery, Philosophy Within Its Proper Bounds, Oxford University Press, 2017, 272pp., $55.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780198807520.

Reviewed by Margot Strohminger, Humboldt University of Berlin


Arguments in philosophy often feature assumptions about (typically counterfactual) circumstances or cases: 'A belief formed in such-and-such circumstances would not be knowledge', 'If a duplicate of me existed in such-and-such circumstances, she would not share all of my beliefs', 'A case in which a duplicate of me exists in such-and-such circumstances is (metaphysically) possible', and so on. Following Edouard Machery and many others, let us call the practice of relying on such assumptions the method of cases. The so-called negative program in experimental philosophy (negative x-phi) defends severe restrictions on the use of the method of cases by appealing to data on untrained folk judgments about cases. Since its inception, negative x-phi has faced the challenge of articulating the extent of the restrictions on the use of the method of cases and how the data support those restrictions. Philosophy Within Its Proper Bounds is the latest attempt from a leading figure in the negative x-phi movement to respond to this challenge.

The bulk of the book is devoted to developing two arguments for the position that we ought to seldom rely on the method of cases. The first argument focuses on the extent to which untrained judgments about cases are influenced by demographic variables and the way in which the cases are presented (this is Chapter 3's 'Unreliability' argument). The second argument is a dilemma which has us consider whether experimental data reveals genuine disagreement between philosophers and non-philosophers about cases (this is Chapter 4's dilemma between 'Dogmatism' and 'Parochialism').

When arguments seek to prohibit a wide range of judgments, there is a danger that some of their premises are disallowed by the prohibition. This danger is arguably realized here. Both the Unreliability and Dogmatism arguments conclude that philosophers ought to suspend judgment in all assumptions about cases with the exception of those known to have a certain feature. According to the conclusion of the Unreliability argument, 'except when a philosophical case is known to elicit a reliable judgment, philosophers ought to suspend judgment about the situations described by philosophical cases' (103). And according to the conclusion of the Dogmatism argument, 'except for those philosophical cases known not to elicit disagreement among peers, philosophers ought to suspend judgment about the situations described by philosophical cases' (127). To reach these conclusions, Machery judges that certain kinds of judgment are influenced by some factors to a degree large enough to threaten their reliability and that philosophers and the folk are 'epistemic peers' on various matters. These seem to be -- or at least in part to rely on -- judgments about cases. For consider how liberal Machery's conception of the method of cases is: 'Philosophers rely on the method of cases when they consider actual or hypothetical situations (described by cases) and determine what facts hold in these situations. These facts then bear, more or less directly, on competing philosophical views' (3). It isn't immediately clear that Machery's judgments about x-phi surveys do not count as prohibited judgments about cases. Certainly x-phi surveys are actual, but Machery's arguments target judgments about actual as well as counterfactual cases. Oddly enough, Machery does not even acknowledge the possibility that his arguments for restricting the use of the method of cases might themselves involve uses of that method that would be ruled out by the proposed restriction. He does not argue that his philosophical cases are known to elicit reliable judgments or that it is known that his epistemic peers will share his judgments.

Of course Machery could also respond to the challenge by retreating to a less liberal conception of cases, one that classifies none of his assumptions as judgments about cases. A natural way to do this is to identify cases with examples. The notion of an example is admittedly rather vague, but we have a good enough rough-and-ready way of sorting paradigms into examples and non-examples for the notion to be of some use here. For example, we say that a Gettier case, whether actual or counterfactual, is an example, and we say that an actual situation in which a survey done according to protocol x produces result y is not an example, at least in a typical context. (However, if a philosopher begins a thought experiment with 'Suppose that a survey done according to protocol x produces result y', we will say that that very same situation is an example.[1])

While adopting this conception of a case enables Machery's arguments to escape his own strictures, it also makes his prescriptions for methodological reform far less radical than he intends. Machery thinks that adopting his strictures would result in significant changes, especially in less 'naturalistic' areas of philosophy: 'As a first approximation, the more naturalistic the research area, the less frequently [the method of cases] is used' (3). (Machery, however, offers no evidence in support of this statistical hypothesis.) More generally Machery creates the impression that his strictures will make work that is not 'naturalistic' and closely related to the sciences all but impossible. In particular, they are supposed to rule out the investigation of what he calls 'modally immodest' theses. These generalizations begin to look rather implausible once we begin to think of cases as examples. The central theses in modal metaphysics are 'modally immodest' if any are. But consider David Lewis' defense of modal realism (1986) or the recent defenses of contingentism and necessitism by Robert Stalnaker (2012) and Timothy Williamson (2013), respectively. To the extent that these authors use examples, they do not do so in anything resembling paradigmatic applications of the method of cases: they acknowledge that their theories have counterintuitive consequences concerning any number of examples. These illustrations are not cherry-picked. The relative unimportance of the method of cases-construed-as-examples can be observed throughout the most influential works of non-'naturalistic' philosophy since the 1970s. For example, the most influential works in the philosophy of language and epistemology in that period are arguably, respectively, David Kaplan's 'Demonstratives' and Timothy Williamson's Knowledge and Its Limits, and the role of examples in these works is about as peripheral as it is in the works of metaphysics cited above.

The issue just raised matters for Machery's argument for a form of modal skepticism that he develops in the penultimate chapter. His modal skepticism targets 'many metaphysical necessities of philosophical interest' (187). By 'metaphysical necessities', Machery appears to mean claims of the form, 'It is (metaphysically) necessary that p'. The argument assumes that 'Philosophers must appeal to unusual and atypical philosophical cases to establish [the relevant] metaphysical necessities' (186). But there are routes to knowledge of necessity that do not rely on cases (construed as examples) at all, let alone 'unusual' or 'atypical' ones. Consider the inferential route to knowledge of necessity made famous by Kripke (e.g. 1980: 159): one knows both that p and that p is necessary if true, and then infers that p is necessary. This route may often be illustrated with examples from astronomy and chemistry ('Hesperus = Phosphorus', 'Water is H2O'), but it has long been understood that it is also a route to knowledge of the necessity of many propositions 'of philosophical interest'. For example, we can know the law of noncontradiction to be necessary in this way: we know that it is true, and that it is necessary if true. Machery does not discuss the inferential route to knowledge of necessity, even though it is arguably the least controversial one discussed in the literature. He also does not discuss recent developments in the epistemology of modality, which emphasize that there are many other ways of acquiring modal knowledge.[2]

Machery lays out his positive vision for philosophy in the final chapter. He wants to leave room for philosophy to ask questions about (say) knowledge or causation and not just our concepts of them. He thinks of this work as addressing 'modally modest counterparts' of 'modally immodest' questions that are too difficult to answer (245). However, Machery has little to say about what this kind of work looks like or why it involves a departure from current practice. Instead he focuses his attention on the analysis of concepts, arguing that one of philosophy's central tasks should be 'naturalized conceptual analysis' (209). Naturalized conceptual analysis, as he describes it, investigates concepts, how they vary between people and how they should be modified. Here 'concepts' are to be thought of as subsets of individuals' beliefs and other belief-like states (which he calls 'bliefs') (210-11). To illustrate: your concept of knowledge consists in your belief-like states about knowledge that are retrieved by default from long-term memory. The kind of surveys carried out by experimental philosophers would seem to be tailor-made to this project. The thought is that the survey responses tell us about the respondents' concepts (239).

Part of the appeal of naturalized conceptual analysis is supposed to lie in its feasibility. As the book's first sentence announces, ''The aim of Philosophy Within Its Proper Bounds is simple, albeit ambitious, arrogant some may say: curbing philosophers' flights of fancy and reorienting philosophy toward more humble, but ultimately more important intellectual endeavors' (1, emphasis added). However, on closer examination Machery's proposal begins to look extremely ambitious. According to Machery, 'one of the points of naturalized conceptual analysis is to assess the validity of concepts' (223). Here is how Machery defines invalidity for concepts:

A concept is invalid if and if only if the inferences it disposes us to draw are deficient in some way or other. Concepts can be invalid for many different reasons. When the validity of concepts depends on how the world is (e.g., when we are concerned with the reliability of the inferences underwritten by concepts), I'll say that the point of naturalized conceptual analysis is to assess the empirical validity of concepts. Determining whether the inferences underwritten by a concept are empirically valid, for instance, whether they are reliable, requires two things: understanding the content of a concept (i.e., what bliefs constitute it) and relevant empirical knowledge about the world. (223)

Machery illustrates how to assess the validity of concepts with the concept of innateness. But consider how we might assess the validity of a more central philosophical concept like that of knowledge or necessity. To do this, we would need to have relevant knowledge about knowledge or necessity to serve as a benchmark against which to compare our concepts. And acquiring that knowledge would amount to just doing epistemology or modal metaphysics. Thus Machery's project encompasses much of philosophy as it is traditionally construed. But it also goes far beyond it, because it sets itself the task of revising philosophers' (and perhaps also non-philosophers'[3]) concepts. According to Machery's picture, it is not enough that philosophers try to match their philosophical beliefs to reality; they must also concern themselves with revising their philosophical concepts -- that is, the belief-like states concerning philosophical topics that they retrieve by default from long-term memory. Yet there is no indication in the book of how such cognitive engineering might be done on even an individual philosopher. (Presumably some kind of therapeutic regimen would have to be developed and tested as a first step.) The suggestion that such cognitive engineering should be a central aim of philosophy seems, to put it mildly, premature and likely not within the proper bounds of philosophy.

All told, the book delivers significantly less than it promises. It promises a case for radical methodological reform in philosophy, but it is caught in an unacknowledged dilemma: either the proposed reforms are not nearly as radical as it makes them out to be or they threaten to undermine the book's central arguments. Meanwhile, its positive proposal is at least as immodest as the philosophical projects it attacks. While it seems to me unlikely that a reader will learn much about the proper bounds of philosophy from this book, I recommend it to anyone interested in learning about Machery's views on the proper bounds of philosophy.


Thanks to Juhani Yli-Vakkuri for insightful detailed comments on various drafts of this review and to Edouard Machery for clarifying his views in correspondence.


Kaplan, David. 1989. Demonstratives. In Joseph Almog, John Perry, and Howard Wettstein (eds.), Themes from Kaplan. Oxford: Oxford University Press. Completed and circulated in mimeograph in the published form in 1977.

Kripke, Saul. 1980. Naming and Necessity. Oxford: Blackwell.

Lewis, David. 1986. On the Plurality of Worlds. Oxford: Blackwell.

Stalnaker, Robert. 2012. Mere Possibilities. Princeton: Princeton University Press.

Strohminger, Margot, and Yli-Vakkuri, Juhani. 2017. The epistemology of modality. Analysis 77: 825-38.

Williamson, Timothy. 2000. Knowledge and its Limits. Oxford: Oxford University Press.

Williamson, Timothy. 2013. Modal Logic as Metaphysics. Oxford: Oxford University Press.

[1] Thus being a case/example is not a property of scenarios but rather a relation in which a scenario stands to a context in which it is discussed. Thanks to Juhani Yli-Vakkuri for pointing this out.

[2] See Strohminger and Yli-Vakkuri 2017: esp. 834 for discussion of some examples.

[3] 'For instance, our default way of thinking about race may be oppressive, or may lead to oppressive expectations and behaviors . . . To remedy this situation, one could propose a new concept of race, which could be justified by its desirable consequences' (216). Presumably the desirable consequences can only be had if the new concept is adopted by a substantial number of non-philosophers.