Philosophy Without Intuitions

Placeholder book cover

Herman Cappelen, Philosophy Without Intuitions, Oxford University Press, 2012, 256pp., $45.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199644865.

Reviewed by Anna-Sara Malmgren, Stanford University


I'm glad that Cappelen wrote this book. It's an uneven read, but an important contribution. It's important because it (indirectly but effectively) draws attention to some challenging questions that it would be very good for meta-philosophy to get clearer on -- questions about the initial demarcation of its subject matter. In particular: of the subtopic that's sometimes called philosophers' 'reliance on intuitions as evidence'. It's not trivial to pin down this activity -- in a non-question-begging and prima facie plausible way -- ahead of inquiry. But it would seem important that we do so, or at least, that we do our best in this regard (even if our best in the end simply consists in pointing to a bunch of examples). We -- relevant meta-philosophers -- need to somehow home in on the phenomenon to be explored, with enough precision to begin exploring it, but without prejudging any of the hard theoretical questions that our exploration aims to shed light on. How to do that? Well, let's start with what not to do. Presumably it's a bad idea to home in on the target phenomenon -- or try to home in on it -- by means of an initial characterization or criterion that, say, is heavily theoretically loaded, that clearly misclassifies paradigm cases, or that fails to differentiate the phenomenon from anything else of interest. Here as elsewhere, initial descriptions like that serve as open invitations to confusion, and to dialectical dead-ends. By my lights, contemporary philosophical methodology could do with more awareness of this point (and with more direct attempts to tackle it). If Cappelen's book provokes that -- which it might -- then it could mark the beginning of the next meta-philosophical chapter: a chapter that's more self-critical, less sidetracked by contentious and divergent setups, and that, perhaps, contains some real improvements in our understanding of our field. That would be exciting.

I just wish that Cappelen had approached the indicated demarcation problem in a more straightforward and philosophically searching way: that he'd tried harder to figure out for himself which aspect, or aspects, of philosophical practice someone might reasonably be after when they claim that we rely on intuitions as evidence (or rely on intuitive judgments, or use the method of cases, or run thought experiments, or . . . ). To put it frankly: I wish that he'd spent much less ink and effort on what extant philosophers and meta-philosophers say -- and on what he takes them to say -- about the intended domain, and much more ink and effort on what they should be saying. (Especially on what they should say about it by way of initial gloss.)

What actually happens is the following: in part I, Cappelen offers one suggestion on his opponent's behalf -- a possible gloss on what it is to rely on intuitions (as evidence) -- and argues, in systematic detail, that there's no reason to believe that philosophers[1] do that. But the gloss on offer has so little face-value appeal that it's unclear why he bothers with it. Next, in part II, he takes us on a fairly comprehensive journey through recent work in philosophical methodology, and identifies what seems to him the dominant extant view -- or better, family of views -- of what it is to rely on intuitions, from which he extracts a disjunctive list of operational criteria for something to count as a (relied-on) intuition. He then proceeds to argue, again in some detail, that nothing meets those criteria. From that he draws the striking conclusion that there are no intuitions -- hence our reliance on them is a myth: philosophers aren't engaged in any such thing.

But it didn't have to end in this way. A more cautious conclusion (and, I think, the most that Cappelen gives us reason to take seriously[2]) is that the dominant views get the subject matter wrong -- not that there is no subject matter. And a quick glance at the overall shape of the views that get a hearing in part II suggests that they don't exhaust the options. With one exception (to be discussed below) they're all substantive theoretical hypotheses about the key mental states -- the mental states that supposedly are, or provide, the evidence at issue -- interesting but controversial claims about the nature of these states, and their epistemic features (e.g., the claim that intuitions, or intuitive judgments, have a distinctive phenomenology, that they're a priori justified if/when they're justified, and that they have a foundational status in philosophical argumentation; 6-7, 112-113.).

These substantive claims are best regarded as partial candidate explanations of how the intended aspect of our practice works (or would work, if it did) -- of what makes the method of cases a good method (if/when it is), of what kind of evidence exactly intuitions are (or would be), and of how that's possible, etc. They're certainly not obvious enough, or neutral enough on disputed theoretical matters, to figure in a plausible initial specification -- a relevantly non-committal working conception -- of the phenomenon whose detailed operation and epistemology they aim to capture.

But perhaps they presuppose some such conception? Unless the broadly epistemological overall debate that these substantive claims are contributions to is deeply confused -- which presumably shouldn't be assumed at the outset -- there ought to be some less committal way of fixing on their subject matter (or subject matters, leaving open that there might be more than one, and that the debate might involve at least some crossed wires). The natural next step, then, is to try to come up with that: with a less committal specification or identifying procedure. If it turns out that that's unavailable -- or that it's available, but that nothing (or nothing remotely puzzling, or everything) satisfies even the less committal specification -- then perhaps a 'nihilist', or error theoretic, conclusion in the spirit of Cappelen's is indeed in place.

Later I'll suggest a different outcome. The present point, however, is that the step just sketched would seem to be crucial in a proper vindication of the nihilist conclusion. And my main complaint about the book is that Cappelen doesn't take this step -- or even show that he sees its significance.

To be fair, substantive epistemological and psychological claims of the sort Cappelen considers are quite regularly put forward, as though they were neutral common ground: as initial characterizations of the phenomenon under investigation.[3] This is one major source of the discontent with the state of the art in meta-philosophy that I expressed at the outset. And perhaps it explains, at least in part, why Cappelen didn't push the issue further -- perhaps he was misled by what these authors say that they're theorizing about (when, really, they're already theorizing about it).

Still, if your concern is to explore the radical hypothesis that a given field or research project (here, in meta-philosophy) doesn't have a subject matter, you must surely be prepared to look beyond the specific descriptions, supposedly of it, that are offered by actual participants in that project -- especially descriptions that look like non-starters when advanced as neutral common ground, relative to the questions and concerns that drive the project. (Here, questions such as: 'How, if at all, can thought experiments provide knowledge in philosophy?', 'What, if anything, gives intuitions evidential weight?', and/or 'What, if anything, justifies intuitive judgments?', 'To what extent -- and under what conditions -- are such judgments reliable?, What explains their reliability (if any)?')

* * * * * * *

Let's turn to the details.

Cappelen's stated (and admirably ambitious) overall aim is to show that "on no sensible construal of 'intuitions', 'rely on', 'philosophy', 'evidence' and 'philosopher' is it true that [contemporary, analytic] philosophers in general rely on intuitions when they do philosophy" (3) -- not extensively, nor 'even a little bit' (2). A subsidiary aim is to pinpoint the sensible construals: "to figure out how to interpret Centrality" (3) -- where 'Centrality' is just the following schematic statement of the thesis that he's up against:

Centrality: "contemporary analytic philosophers rely on intuitions as evidence (or as a source of evidence) for philosophical theories". (3)

Nothing he argues turns on the fact that, according to Centrality, philosophers treat intuitions as evidence for their theories -- we can replace 'for' with 'for and/or against' without consequence, and read 'theory' as permissively or restrictively as we see fit. Nor does anything turn on Centrality being framed in terms of evidence -- rather than, say, justificationor reason(s). To see just how inclusive Centrality is supposed to be in this regard, consider that 'Centrality(M)' -- Cappelen's immediate target later in the book -- is offered as a possible precisification of it:

Centrality(M): "philosophers rely (in some epistemically significant way) on intuitions when they make judgments about cases." (96)

Last, nothing turns on Centrality being stated in terms of intuitions -- rather than, say, intuitive judgments or beliefs (or even intuitive verdicts or contents). Cappelen uses 'intuition' and 'intuitive judgment' more or less interchangeably. But it's worth pointing out that he's sensitive to the difference between meta-philosophical theories that postulate a kind of mental state, with relevant evidential import, that's distinct from belief -- typically called 'intuition' -- and theories that don't: theories on which the key mental states are simply beliefs, or beliefs of a certain kind -- typically called 'intuitions' or 'intuitive judgments' or both. Centrality is supposed to be neutral on this issue, too.

Cappelen's overarching strategy is to examine two broad lines of defense of Centrality, that he takes to be tacitly assumed among those who endorse it -- 'the argument from 'intuition'-talk', and 'the argument from philosophical practice' (4-7). The former is altogether a rational reconstruction, whereas the latter has some real-life support. Each argument type is assessed in turn, and it's concluded that neither in the end supports a viable version of Centrality. Along the way, a range of different versions of Centrality are spelled out and challenged (on their merits, at least to some extent) -- versions that exploit our 'intuition'-talk, and that exploit some aspect of philosophical practice, respectively.

The clearest presentation of the argument from 'intuition'-talk Cappelen provides goes as follows: "Here's a natural thought: if philosophers characterize key premises in central philosophical arguments as 'intuitive' and refer to the evidence for their theories as 'intuitions', we have good reason to think they rely on intuitions as evidence -- after all, we're just taking them at their word." (25) Well, let's suppose -- what, on a natural reading, seems innocuous -- that philosophers often use 'intuition' and cognates in roughly these ways. Suppose also that a principle of interpretative charity (of some or other sort) demands that these philosophers be 'taken at their word' -- i.e., let's grant that they by and large use 'intuition'-terminology correctly, in the contexts gestured at. What follows? What rendition of Centrality, if any, does the resultant line of reasoning support?

Most straightforwardly, perhaps, a version that defers to the indicated usage: that takes intuitions to be whatever philosophers refer to when they apply 'intuition' to key premises in central arguments, etc. (cf. 27-28). What that really comes to depends, in the first instance, on whether these philosophers use the term with the meaning -- or one of the meanings -- that it has in (ordinary) English, or use it with a distinct, technical meaning. It also, of course, depends on what those meanings are (or are supposed to be), and on what referents these meanings determine. Cappelen explores a number of available options here (29-87). First he discusses various ways in which 'intuition'-terminology is used in English -- no real surprises here: it's a complicated mess -- then he clarifies, and criticizes, the idea that there's a (determinate and coherent) technical philosophers' usage. He also searches through a representative sample of philosophical texts, for signs that intuitions -- as understood on the corresponding version(s) of Centrality, stated in either English or "philosopher's English" -- are treated as evidence. But he finds none.

This discussion has some independent interest (and entertainment value) but, to my mind, it's way too long. It takes up more than a third of the book -- that's too much, given that the argument from 'intuition'-talk isn't just a straw man's argument, but seems hopeless; to clarify: hopeless unless reduced to an argument for Centrality of the next broad type: the argument from philosophical practice.

Here's a weak but perfectly plausible claim about the use of 'intuition' and cognates among (a sizeable contingent of contemporary analytic) philosophers: that there's at least one established use of 'intuition' such that, when philosophers use the term in that way, and apply it to a given content or mental state, x, in the context of a certain kind of dialectic, they also treat -- or at least tend to treat -- as evidence. However, their application of the term 'intuition' to x hardly constitutes their treating as evidence. Nor, it would seem, does their application to x of the corresponding concept. So this observation alone -- that philosophers sometimes call a state or content x 'intuition' -- does nothing to vindicate Centrality. And it doesn't help to take these philosophers 'at their word': to grant that they apply the term correctly in applying it to x. We need to know what else they do with x!

That is: to get a decent argument for Centrality off the ground -- on this, weak but plausible, assumption about usage -- we (also) need a more specific description of what philosophers do when they treat x as evidence, in the relevant dialectical contexts: what they're doing with respect to x that warrants saying that they're treating it as evidence.[4] But it seems a safe bet that, once we have that description, the fact that they call x 'intuition' will drop out of consideration as irrelevant. And what we're left with is basically an argument from philosophical practice.

To avoid this kind of collapse, we must take the argument from 'intuition'-talk to have a stronger premise: that there's an established usage of 'intuition' such that, to apply the term tox -- or, at least, to classify x as falling under the concept it expresses (on the given usage) -- just is to treat x as evidence. The most generous way I can see to spell this out, in turn, is as the claim that there's a usage on which 'intuition' is synonymous with some such term as 'evidence' or 'evidence of type t' (where t is some independently specified evidence-type). The idea, then, would be that when philosophers say or think that x is an intuition -- in this sense -- they a fortiori say or think that x is evidence. And to do that is presumably (a way) to treat x as evidence.

Unfortunately, however, the synonymy thesis doesn't seem remotely plausible.[5]

The details of Cappelen's criticism of the argument suggest that he, indeed, takes it in the second way. E.g., in discussing three standard uses of 'intuition'-terminology -- that he has just invoked in his interpretation of some philosophical texts -- he argues:

[First:] Saying that p, with a hedge (i.e., not as a full-out assertion), is in no way to treat something called intuition as evidence or a source of evidence. [Second:] When 'intuitive' is used to mean the same as 'pre-theoretic' the speaker is saying that p is a judgment that has been or can be justified without taking a stand on the question under discussion. This doesn't identify an evidential source for p or say anything about how p is justified. So again Centrality is not supported. [Third:] Snap interpretations provide no support for Centrality. If I tell you that p is a claim that's easy to process, or the answer you'd come to without thinking very carefully, those are not features that in any way constitute a source of evidence." (81, italics in original. See also 77-79.)

The only way that I can make sense of these complaints is by taking them to be directed at the wild assumption that the presumed evidential status (or even: specific evidential type) of intuitions can be read off the meaning of 'intuition', on at least one usage of the term. But why would anyone think that? Perhaps the idea is worth passing mention, but surely not more -- in particular since no one ever held it.[6]

* * * * * * *

The argument from philosophical practice looks more promising. (It also has extant proponents -- likewise for the renditions of Centrality that Cappelen associates with it.) This argument isn't supposed to appeal to our use of 'intuition'-terminology, but, instead, to the 'implicit reliance on intuitions in philosophical practice' (96, italics in original). Cappelen introduces it by saying: "Here is how I think that the second argument for Centrality should ideally be presented: a proponent of Centrality first specifies a set of features she thinks intuitive judgments have, say F1, . . . Fn, and then tries to show that the judgments philosophers rely on at central points in their arguments have F1, . . . Fn" (5).

Judging from this passage, however, it's not clear that what Cappelen is recommending to his adversary goes beyond the suggestion that she, first, explicate Centrality, and, second, argue that it's true. That tactic doesn't preclude anything much -- not even appeals to 'intuition'-talk -- so Cappelen must have a more specific strategy in mind. And he does: it's evident from the surrounding text that the features that are supposed to be included in the set -- of "features [the Centrality proponent] thinks intuitive judgments have" -- are features that directly tie these judgments to some aspect of philosophical method or practice: that identify a particular role in it for them (distinct from that of being called 'intuition', etc.).[7] The next step is to show that that role is realized in some actual philosophical debates, and -- unless, I presume, that's already part of the role -- that its realizers are treated as evidence.

One candidate role of this kind is at the heart of the 'method of cases' -- roughly: the method of testing philosophical theories against intuitions about (typically hypothetical) problem cases.[8] Other possible roles, or practice-referencing features, that Cappelen initially treats as options here are: being a foundational (or 'rock-bottom') starting-point in philosophical argumentation, being a critical tool in conceptual analysis, and being what secures a priori (or other 'armchair') status for philosophical theorizing (6-7). Later on, having 'a distinctive phenomenology or etiology or both' gets added to the original list (105). Each listed feature also gets elaborated in some detail -- in ways that are richly informed by what a diverse range of prominent meta-philosophers have said about the nature and epistemology of intuitions (e.g., Bealer, Goldman, Sosa, Weinberg, and Williamson). Finally, the list is supplemented with some complex operational criteria -- 'diagnostics for intuitiveness' -- that Cappelen brings along on his next round of scrutiny of philosophical texts. (The diagnostics include being 'evidence recalcitrant', 'non-inferential and non-experiential', 'based solely on conceptual competence', and having 'seems-true' phenomenology; 112-113; 130-188.) It's when the second search, too, turns up nothing, that Cappelen concludes that intuitions don't exist.

It's not entirely clear where the diagnostics end, and the features they're supposed to be tracking begin, but this doesn't really matter. More importantly, it's unclear what motivates certain pairings (e.g., why evidence recalcitrance is supposed to indicate rock-bottom status; 112). Likewise for Cappelen's further elaborations, and specific uses, of some of the diagnostics in the course of his search. (E.g., why an author's puzzlement or uncertainty regarding p -- or her giving arguments for p -- is supposed to count against her judgment that p having either seems-true phenomenology or rock-bottom status; 136, 161.) What I want to focus on, however, is that we're not provided with a diagnostic for the first practice-referencing feature in particular -- intuitions' role in the method of cases. Cappelen doesn't articulate any further attributes that are meant to specifically indicate that that role is realized. (Nor are we told in much detail how the role or method is conceived.) Instead, a reference to the method gets built into Centrality -- it becomes Centrality(M) -- and the diagnostics that Cappelen provides for the other features on the list are used to evaluate Centrality(M).

I think this is a mistake. It effectively eliminates the only uncontroversial feature on Cappelen's list -- indeed, the only feature on that list that's even safely ascribed to paradigmaticintuitions. Once that feature's gone, the outcome of his second search for intuitions is of much less interest (even if we grant that it's otherwise conducted properly). The most that the failure of that search gives us reason to doubt is that Centrality (or Centrality(M)) is correct on a construal that takes intuitions to have rock-bottom and/or a priori status, a characteristic phenomenology, and/or a critical role in conceptual analysis. But the attribution of any one of these features -- certainly as glossed by Cappelen -- to the mental states that Centrality is about is a highly unobvious, theoretical claim about them: one that's most charitably seen as presupposing some other, less committal, mode of identification.

In Malmgren 2011 (268), I suggested that we simply identify the key mental states -- in the locution I prefer: intuitive judgments -- by reference to paradigms (in turn described as innocuously as possible).[9] Paradigms might include a judgment I made, in response to my first Gettier case -- a judgment naturally expressed in some such way as: 'Smith has a justified true belief, but doesn't know, that someone in his office owns a Ford' (Gettier 1963). Or a judgment you made, about Thomson's Violinist case, and that you might express by saying: 'it's permissible to free oneself from the violinist, even though he'll die as a result' (Thomson 1971). Or a judgment one of our students (or colleagues or suitable friends) made about Searle's Chinese Room case, and that they expressed by saying: 'the Chinese Room passes the Turing test, but doesn't understand Chinese' (Searle 1980). Examples are easily multiplied. (Cappelen is just wrong that we lack sufficient agreement on paradigms -- for the purpose of pointing to our subject-matter, that is; cf. 53-55.)

The indirect specification of the judgments' contents allows us to leave open whether those contents should be paraphrased -- and if so, how -- when the problem cases they're about are recognized to be non-actual. (Alternatively, we can hedge the specification, as in: 'loosely put, the judgment that p' or 'a judgment to the effect that p'.) Second, by 'judgment' I mean 'occurrent belief'. We may also want to include as paradigms some instances of inclination to believe (cf. Lewis 1983; Williamson 2007), or 'near-belief' -- on a threshold model: high confidence that's not quite high enough for full belief. Third, a good paradigm presumably involves a representative thought experimenter -- an agent who's at least ostensibly competent with the method of cases -- but I trust we all know someone like that. Fourth: the local dialectical context of the sample judgments is crucial: it's the context of a paradigmatic application of that method -- the execution of a thought experiment designed to test a particular philosophical hypothesis or theory.

I still think that paradigms serve the purpose: they enable us to home in on the key mental states in a relevantly non-committal way, and with enough precision to formulate and start pursuing intelligent questions about their nature and epistemology. (Leaving open that the interesting generalizations might turn out to extend far beyond the paradigms, and/or not cover them all.)

But I also think that we can say a little more -- if only to clarify what prima facie unifies the canonical cases. So here's a first stab at a general, minimal, characterization:

An intuitive judgment (or intuition) is an occurrent belief, or near-belief, to the effect that the 'test properties' are distributed in a certain way in the salient problem case -- where the identity of the test properties is determined by the philosophical hypothesis that's under evaluation -- a belief with a strong modal projection pattern,[10] whose proximate etiology and epistemic ground are largely subjectively opaque.

In brief: the 'test properties' are the properties whose modal (and/or explanatory) connection is the immediate target of the given thought-experiment. So which lower-order properties qualify as test properties depends on which philosophical claim that experiment is, in the first instance, aimed at testing. Perhaps it's the claim that Fx iff Gx; then and Gare the test properties. (In general, it can take some work to figure out what the target claim is, hence what the test properties are.) As part of the experiment, a specific scenario -- the problem case -- is presented by description; a scenario that needn't be actual. The description of it is, or at least aims to be, neutral with respect to the distribution of the test properties. (It doesn't explicitly stipulate that, say, the case instantiates F-ness but not G-ness, nor does it stipulate anything that transparently entails this.)[11]

Finally (and roughly) a judgment's etiology and epistemic ground is 'largely subjectively opaque' when ordinary introspective and reflective means don't suffice to identify a satisfactory causal-psychological explanation of it, nor an adequate epistemic justification for it. At best, such means suffice to identify fragments of an explanation and justification. This, I take it, is indeed a characteristic of canonical intuitive judgments -- and one of the reasons why they're intriguing. The thought experimenter can't easily figure out why she made a particular intuitive judgment (e.g., that the case is but not G) rather than another (e.g., that it's F and G) or what -- if anything -- made it rational for her to do so.[12]Nevertheless, she typically takes the judgment to have some evidential weight. How is this manifested? By her reasoning from it (or, perhaps, from a second-order belief about it) -- e.g., to the conclusion that the hypothesis under evaluation is implausible or false (or true, or at least still standing, or . . . ) This is what it is to treat intuitions as evidence.

A construal of Centrality in terms of beliefs of this type is perfectly compatible with the view that mental states of some other variety -- e.g., quasi-experiences with seems-true phenomenology -- play an evidential role in philosophy, even in the method of cases. (For all I care we can even reserve 'intuition'-talk for such states, if there are any; 267-268.) But, as I hope is clear by now, I regard that view as (part of) a candidate account of what, if anything, makes it rational to believe a certain content, in the context of a thought experiment, and proceed to use that content as a premise in (further) philosophical reasoning and argumentation. Understood in this way, the view isn't just compatible with, but presupposes, a version of Centrality of the kind I endorse. And that, it seems, goes for all the other views of intuitions that Cappelen considers.

I've argued that Cappelen fails to refute Centrality ('on any reasonable construal' of the central terms). But his book may well trigger a more nuanced overall discussion of the thesis. All in all, it's a refreshing and provocative leftfield attack -- one that we probably deserve.



Thanks to Herman Cappelen, Mark Crimmins and Mike Raven for helpful feedback on an earlier draft. 


Bealer, G., 1998, "Intuition and the Autonomy of Philosophy", in DePaul, M. & Ramsey, W. eds., 1998,. Rethinking Intuition: The Psychology of Intuition and Its Role in Philosophical Inquiry. Lanham, MD: Rowman & Littlefield. pp. 201-239.

Knobe, J. & Nichols, S., 2007, "An Experimental Philosophy Manifesto", in Knobe and Nichols, eds. 2007, Experimental Philosophy, New York: OUP.

Lewis, D., 1978, "Truth in Fiction," American Philosophical Quarterly, 15: 37-46, in Lewis 1983, Philosophical Papers: Volume I, New York: OUP.

Malmgren, A-S., 2011, "Rationalism and the Content of Intuitive Judgments," Mind, 120: 263-327.

Pust, J., 2000, Intuitions as Evidence, New York: Routledge.

Sosa, E. 2007a. Experimental philosophy and philosophical intuition. Philosophical Studies, 132: 99-107.

Sosa, E. 2007b. A virtue epistemology: Apt belief and reflective knowledge, volume 1. Oxford: OUP.

Weinberg, J. 2007, "How to Challenge Intuitions Empirically Without Losing Skepticism", Midwest Studies in Philosophy, Vol 31, pp 318-343.

Williamson, T., 2007, The Philosophy of Philosophy, New York: Routledge.

Gettier, E. 1963. "Is justified true belief knowledge?" 23: 121-123.

Thomson, J.J., 1971, "A Defense of Abortion", Philosophy & Public Affairs, Vol. 1, # 1, 47-66.

Searle, J., 1980, 'Minds, Brains and Programs', Behavioral and Brain Sciences, 3: 417-57.

[1] Throughout the scope of his investigation is restricted to contemporary analytic philosophers.

[2] 'The most' since his selection of operational criteria, and subsequent use of them, raises additional questions. I'll touch on these points again below (but lack the space to discuss them in detail).

[3] E.g., Bealer 1998, 2000; Knobe and Nichols, 2007; Pust 2000; Sosa 2007a, b; Weinberg 2007.

[4] Arguably that can be provided -- e.g., along the lines I suggest below.

[5] Perhaps there's an established usage on which 'x is an intuition', 'it's intuitive that x' is synonymous with (something like) 'x is prima facie plausible' or 'on the face of it, x'. But to think that x is prima facie plausible still isn't to think that x is evidence; at most, it's to think that is potential (prima facie) evidence. (And nothing less than synonymy -- such as a co-extensionality, or the even weaker claim endorsed above -- will give us a freestanding argument for Centrality.)

[6] Some of Cappelen's objections suggest that he also takes it to have the (wild) premise that 'intuition' has a unique use in ordinary/philosophers' English. (E.g., "When a speaker of English says 'Intuitively, BLAH', that doesn't show that she is relying on intuitions as evidence. First, what she says is highly context-sensitive and there is no one content that is expressed by such utterances (and so no one version of Centrality can be supported)." 41. Cf. 47, 77.) But his overall case against the strategy doesn't founder on this.

[7] The specification of this role may or may not be paramount to an explication of Centrality/Centrality(M). (If the selected features are held to be constitutive of intuitions, it will be. If not, it could go either way.)

[8] Here's how Cappelen describes it: "MOC: A theory of some philosophical topic XT, is an adequate theory only if it can account for (or explain or predict) intuitions about X in actual and possible cases" (96, cf. 6).

[9] Cappelen addresses this suggestion, but mistakenly construes it as part of an attempt to resuscitate the argument from intuition-talk (53-55). (Nor was my proposed solution to the ‘content problem’ meant to be part of the initial characterization of the paradigms.)

[10] What I called 'implicit generality' in my 2011 (see in, particular, §2.3).

[11] Sometimes a case description that we treat as legitimate does indeed explicitly stipulate a certain distribution of the test properties. But as long as the stipulation can relatively easily be dispensed with -- substituted for a 'neutral' stipulation -- it would seem that the description is legitimate. (Whether this requirement is always met is another matter.)

[12] This is compatible with a variety of substantive accounts of its de facto epistemic ground. Indeed, my gloss leaves open that intuitive judgments have a relatively familiar justificatory (and/or causal) structure -- inferential, perceptual, testimonial, etc. That's as it should be, since the only thing that's obvious, at the outset, is that they don't fall neatly into any of the familiar categories.