Phänomenologie des Lebendigen: Heideggers Kritik an den Leitbegriffen der neuzeitlichen Biologie

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Thomas Kessel, Phänomenologie des Lebendigen: Heideggers Kritik an den Leitbegriffen der neuzeitlichen Biologie, Karl Alber, 2011, 294pp., €39.00, ISBN 9783495484692.

Reviewed by Daniel Dahlstrom, Boston University


In this masterful study that is bound to alter the landscape of research into Heidegger's early work, Thomas Kessel demonstrates the folly of marginalizing Heidegger's treatments of organisms and animals. Following a comprehensive review of secondary literature, including the relevant writings of prominent critics (e.g., Sartre, Löwith, Derrida), and a sketch of the Cartesian concern underlying the modern understanding of science that Heidegger aims to undo, the introduction charts the development of his hermeneutical phenomenology. Kessel takes his readers through the topics and themes dominating Heidegger's earliest engagement with philosophy, from its roots in the Neo-Kantian problem of categories addressed by his habilitation and first publications, through his fruitful combination of the Husserlian doctrine of categorical intuition with an interpretation of aletheia, to his conception of phenomenology in Sein und Zeit. The introduction concludes with a précis of the claim made in Sein und Zeit that the path to an ontological determination of the living -- "neither purely being-on-hand nor also Dasein" -- is a "reductive privation on the basis of the ontology of Dasein" (p. 67).

Kessel aims to supplement Heidegger's thinking by elaborating turning points within the history of biology that captured Heidegger's attention and imagination. His pursuit of this aim is evident in Part One, "Heidegger's Critique of the Leading Concepts of Modern Biology." Kessel documents how the young Heidegger, in the interest of defending the Catholic faith, criticizes versions of Darwin-inspired theories of descent, in part on strictly scientific grounds. The criticisms reveal that Heidegger had more than passing familiarity with contemporary biological theory and controversy, notably, in the form of Ernst Häckel's claims for a reductionist monism and Oscar Hertwig's criticisms of them. He also displays a budding interest in the essential structure of the living and the animal, likely motivated by the work of Franz Doflein who gave an early characterization of "ecology" as "the relations of organisms to their surroundings" (pp. 85-86). Kessel then turns to the different traditional interpretations of life, La Mettrie's radical mechanism, Kant's critical teleology, and the debates among vitalists (Wilhelm Roux, Hans Driesch, and Hans Spemann). While Heidegger accepts Spemann's arguments that entelechy is dispensable (as Heidegger later puts it, "vitalism is as dangerous as mechanism" for biology), he accepts the insight of Roux and Driesch that the ground of the organism cannot be a question of a mathematical chain of cause and effect (pp. 119-25). In addition to demonstrating Heidegger's extensive understanding of these various approaches and his frequently critical stance towards them, Kessel suggests how this understanding illuminates Heidegger's existential analysis.

In Part Two, "Phenomenological Determination of the Living," Kessel draws on Heidegger's lectures on Aristotle (1924), ancient philosophy (1926), and Leibniz (1928), but especially his most extensive treatment of the living and animals in the 1929/30 lectures, "Fundamental Concepts of Metaphysics." Equipped with reviews of the biological theories upon which Heidegger draws, Kessel elaborates Heidegger's own distinctive conception of organisms and animals. The elaboration is instructive, arguably even essential to clarifying the structural similarities and fundamental differences, in Heidegger's eyes, between humans (conceived as Dasein) and animals. Heidegger conceives organisms, as Kessel illustrates, in terms of their self-advancing and self-regulating drives and facilities (in contrast to artifacts' preparedness). From Heidegger's interpretation of the urge-phenomenon via Leibniz' conception of appetitus, Kessel even draws the imposing inference that "the urge-phenomenon and not the environment demonstrates itself to be the genuine motor of evolution" (p. 176). Kessel also demonstrates the complex relation of an animal's drives to its surroundings, surroundings that unleash those drives, in a phenomenon that Heidegger labels "captivation" (Benommenheit) -- yet another notion conceived as a privation of Dasein's existence (and in Being and Time already associated with inauthentic existence). Particularly valuable in this connection are Kessel's accounts of the importance of Jacob von Uexküll's work for Heidegger. Kessel explains how von Uexküll's model of the animal environment influences Heidegger's account of animals, how his work on amoeba provides the backdrop for Heidegger's claim, inspired by Aristotle, that animals have organs because they have certain facilities rather than vice versa, and how his studies of bee-behavior underlie Heidegger's contention that animals behave (sich benehmen) towards their surroundings (Umwelt) rather than comporting themselves (sich verhalten) to a world (Welt). Kessel also reviews aspects of Ernst von Baer's embryological and morphogenetic studies of mammals that Heidegger singles out for praise.

The review of von Baer's work and its impact on Heidegger is abbreviated to a fault, though it further underscores Heidegger's engagement, not only with the biology of his contemporaries, but with its history as well (von Baer discovered the cells of mammals in 1827). Yet there is a further issue that begs to be considered, namely, the import of that engagement for Heidegger's philosophical analyses. While effectively demonstrating that Heidegger draws extensively on these biological theories, Kessel does not address the question of the possible limitations of doing so. How, if at all, do the historical datedness of these studies and their empirical restrictiveness constrain Heidegger's phenomenology, aimed as it is at elaborating the ontological status of animals? How does Heidegger -- and, indeed, how should he -- conceive the relationship between empirical investigation and phenomenological analysis? In this connection it may have proven helpful to revisit Heidegger's attempt to rethink essences around the very time that he is intensively appropriating biological accounts of organisms and animals, namely, in his 1930 lecture "The Essence of Truth." In this connection it also bears noting that Heidegger did not remain satisfied with the account he gives in his 1929/30 lectures (Kessel's main source). In his Contributions to Philosophy (1936-38) Heidegger directly criticizes his earlier talk of the world-poorness of animals (a criticism that Kessel omits).

In the third and final part of Kessel's study, he tackles two controversial sides of Heidegger's thinking that bear on his phenomenology of the living: bodiliness and philosophical anthropology. In different ways Karl Löwith, Helmut Plessner, and J. P. Sartre all criticized Heidegger for neglecting the body in Being and Time. Kessel cites two responses by Heidegger to this criticism. On the one hand, Heidegger justifies the supposed neglect by contending that clarification of the basic structures of Dasein, in a way that is neutral with respect to the body and sexuality, is a condition for a phenomenology of the body. On the other hand, Heidegger himself confessed to finding the problem of the body as "the most difficult" and not having known what more to say "at the time" (namely, in Being and Time). Without squaring these two responses to one another, Kessel proposes that the place for a treatment of the phenomenon of Dasein's body lies in the metontology proposed by Heidegger. This proposal is intriguing and it no doubt is close to Heidegger's own thinking circa 1928, when he introduces the concept of metontology as a part (along with fundamental ontology) of a metaphysics of Dasein. However, most of the rest of the section is devoted to a reconstruction of Heidegger's account of bodiliness in general terms, a reconstruction that relies heavily upon the Zollikon Seminars. The result is a valuable gloss of Heidegger's mature account but it remains unclear how this account is metontological (especially since Heidegger by that time seems committed to discarding metontology as a part of metaphysics).

Sorting through Heidegger's criticism of the idea of philosophical anthropology as well as his own suggestions of an existential anthropology and an ontic anthropology, Kessel trenchantly argues that Heidegger, far from rejecting a suitably understood psychology or anthropology, clearly recognized its potential. Crucial for this argument are, once again, the Zollikon Seminars where Heidegger speaks of an "ontic" anthropology, based upon the existential analysis of Dasein. Kessel is no doubt right to interpret Heidegger as endorsing the possibilities for psychology and anthropology, based upon rigorous existential or at least phenomenological analyses. However, the interpretation also reopens questions regarding the relation between the two tiers of Heidegger's analyses, already evident, not only in his early differentiation of ontic and ontological dimensions, but also in his insistence that the roots of the existential analysis are ultimately ontic (as he puts it in Section Five of Being and Time).

To his credit, Kessel is not oblivious to these questions. His book accordingly ends with some brief but pertinent, forward-looking considerations of the prospects and promise of phenomenological approaches to biology and anthropology, based upon Heidegger's existential analysis of Dasein. While Kessel sees every possibility of realizing a phenomenological anthropology (in keeping with Dasein) on the foundation of ontology, he insists that ontic determinations count in this process no less than do the ontological structures that present themselves on the basis of those determinations. Nor, he adds, is it permissible to posit the foundation as absolute. "Such research can be promising only if the ontic and ontological sides, as equal partners, are fruitful for one another in a reciprocal way. Hence, it cannot be a matter of subsuming everything under one posited existential" (p. 274). These considerations are a fitting end to an excellent study of a side of Heidegger's thinking that is too often neglected.