Photography and Philosophy: Essays on the Pencil of Nature

Placeholder book cover

Scott Walden (ed.), Photography and Philosophy: Essays on the Pencil of Nature, Blackwell Publishing, 2008, 325pp., $79.95 (hbk), ISBN 9781405139243.

Reviewed by John Andrew Fisher, University of Colorado at Boulder


Shows devoted to photography seem to be everywhere in the art world. As Scott Walden, the editor of this collection of essays notes, photography "has become the darling of the avant-garde." It appears that photography has become trendier than painting. One reason for this may be that while the nature and scope of painting has been thoroughly investigated over the last two centuries, photography appears to be relatively unexplored. Moreover, as a medium photography has the advantage over both painting and sculpture of permeating social life and thus of appearing to be easier to understand in an art-world setting than other art forms. In addition, the variety of uses of photography in everyday life -- portraits, snapshots, fashion and advertising photographs -- provide artists with a multitude of genres to explore and often parody.

Perhaps surprisingly then, only a few of the thirteen essays that make up this collection directly address the artistic or conceptual content of current art photography. This is not to say that the collection is in any way disappointing. On the contrary, it is a ground-breaking, cutting-edge anthology of essays by leading analytic philosophers of art all focused in one way or another on the foundations of photography. In his contribution to the collection, Walden elaborates on his focus on truth in images with an explanation that could also serve as a rationale for the entire collection:

the operative assumption here is that the best methodology for understanding our appreciation of pictures involves first developing an understanding of their most literal aspects, and then proceeding to an understanding of the more complex aspects in terms of these relatively simple ones… . The faith is that if we can understand truth in relation to the depiction of the simple, visible properties of people and objects depicted, we can then, in terms of these and some other -- as yet undetermined -- principles governing the viewing of pictures, arrive at a more comprehensive understanding of the use of images in journalism, advertising, illustration, and art. (p. 94)

This faith might seem debatable, but in fact these essays do indirectly illuminate photography as art even when that is not their primary goal. By undermining the complacency with which we approach a mass art medium, they indirectly address the central aesthetic question that arises in looking at art photography: "In what ways can I appreciate a photograph aesthetically?"

Why does photography merit extended philosophical examination? Few other art media have troubled art theorists as much as photography, and this has been true since its inception in the nineteenth-century. Only instrumental classical music has fascinated philosophers as much. In pure instrumental music there is no intrinsic representational content, yet the music feels as if it is saying something and sounds as if it expresses emotions. In the case of photography we have the opposite problem: instead of too little representation, we have nothing but pure representation; we see nothing in a photograph but the objects that are photographed.

There are four fundamental issues that underlie the more specific themes of these essays: (i) What is the nature of photography? (ii) Given this nature, can photographs as photographs be fine art? (iii) How does photographic representation differ from other types of visual representation? and (iv) In what way are photographs more realistic, objective or true than representations produced in more traditional media?

Most of the papers were written especially for this anthology, although three chapters are reprints of papers by prominent figures in analytic aesthetics (Kendall Walton, Roger Scruton, Arthur Danto). Two of these papers, Walton's "Transparent Pictures: On the Nature of Photographic Realism," and Scruton's "Photography and Representation," are classics and serve to anchor the anthology by providing influential albeit controversial accounts of the foundations of photography. Walton argues that photographs are 'transparent,' by which he means that in looking at photographs we "quite literally" see their subjects. Scruton argues that a photograph cannot be what he calls a "representation," and by this he intends to imply that it cannot qua photograph be a work of art. To make their arguments, these two thinkers develop extended analyses of concepts central to photographs: in Walton's case, the concepts of seeing and visual experience, and in Scruton's case, the concept of an artistic representation. In relating photography to more general concepts, these papers join several others in the anthology. For example, Danto argues that individuals have rights over the way they appear, a meditation spawned by what he regards as untruthful photographic portraits.

Although the anthology is not divided into sections, one can collect most of the articles into three main groupings. The first group consists of five articles, all directed at analyses of the realism, objectivity, and truth that we attach to photographs: Walton on the transparency of photography, Cynthia Freeland on icons, Aaron Meskin and Jonathan Cohen on evidence, Walden on truth and Barbara Savedoff on authority. Danto's contribution, "The Naked Truth," also explores the specific sort of truth that might be ascribed to photographic portraits. He proposes a distinction between the optical truth that a high-speed photograph, which he calls a 'still,' might reveal and the natural way we see people or things. He argues that the "still … shows the world as we are not able to perceive it visually. It shows us the world from the perspective of stopped time" (300). Such photos often lie as portraits, Danto thinks, and when they do, they violate the personhood of the subject by failing to respect the image the subject desires to project to the community.

In "Transparent Pictures" Walton aims to understand the sort of realism possessed by photographs. He notes that photographs are not necessarily more accurate than paintings, yet he supports the idea that photography is "a supremely realistic medium" (21)). There is a gap, in his view, between the realism and immediacy of photography and what can be achieved by painting. He rejects the idea that in looking at a photograph we are having an illusion, as if we are mistaking the photograph for the objects photographed. His big claim is rather that photography "gave us a new way of seeing" (21). He means this quite literally: "Nor is my point that what we see -- photographs -- are duplicates or doubles or reproductions of objects … My claim is that we see, quite literally, our dead relatives themselves when we look at photographs of them" (22). He argues for this in several ways. One is a slippery slope argument, moving from seeing objects by means of mirrors, telescopes, etc. to seeing objects via live broadcast television, to seeing objects in documentary film. Although this implies seeing the past, he thinks we accept that we see events that occurred millions of years ago through a telescope. He does allow that we see photographed objects indirectly. Nor does he claim that we fail to see the photographs themselves. We see the objects -- our dead relatives -- by seeing the photograph; "one hears both a bell and the sound that it makes" (24).

Don't we also say that we 'see' Lincoln in a painting? Walton argues that this is fictional seeing, and this is because the sort of seeing involved applies equally to non-existent painted objects. Walton's theory of photography and of the way it differs from painting is based on the mechanical process of forming images which characterizes photography. Whether through an optical-and-chemical or digital process, once the shutter is triggered the image is determined by what is in front of the lens, not by the beliefs of the photographer:

The essential difference between paintings and photographs is the difference in the manner in which in which they … are based on beliefs of their makers. Photographs are counterfactually dependent on the photographic scene even if the beliefs (and other intentional attitudes) of the photographer are fixed. Paintings which have a counterfactual dependence on the scene portrayed lose it when the beliefs (and other intentional attitudes) of the painter are fixed. (38)

If a painter who is trying to depict the scene in front of her believes that there is a gorilla in the scene, she will put it in the painting even if it is not actually there, whereas even if a photographer also has that belief, a gorilla will not appear in the image if one does not exist in front of the camera.

The transparency of photographs is not about how photographs look, but about how we take them to imply that the objects we see in them existed. This explains, he suggests, why we experience a sort of shock when we learn that a Chuck Close photo-realist self-portrait is not a photograph: "We feel somehow less 'in contact with' Close when we learn that the portrayal of him is not photographic" (27). By contrast, "[v]iewers of photographs are in perceptual contact with the world" (48). This is not to deny that photographs, like some mirrors, can distort, nor that some photographs are constructions (combinations) that taken as a whole are not transparent.

Walton even allows that a "photograph, no less than a painting, has a subjective point of view" (35). Still, his account raises the question of whether the causal process that announces the existence of the objects photographed is the only defining characteristic of photography. Doesn't the photograph also show how these things appeared? Do we not only see our dead relatives, but also that the scene appeared a certain way? Yet that appearance is the result of adjustments of many variables by the photographer. Although Walton says, "[p]hotography can be an enormously expressive medium," (35), it is not obvious how his account of the literal seeing involved in seeing a photograph addresses the subjective and expressive aspects of photographs. In literally seeing the objects in a photograph do we also literally see what they looked like? We think we do, but is there a basis for this thought in the transparency of photography?

The four papers that follow Walton's all grapple with photography's realism or truth. Freeland's "Photographs and Icons" points out that there are two senses of "realism," an epistemological sense related to truth and accuracy, and a psychological sense related to psychological force. She usefully employs terminology of Patrick Maynard's to mark this distinction as the difference between the "depictive" function of a picture and its "manifestation" function, which is similar to Walton's notion that we 'contact' the objects we see in the photograph. By describing an impressive parallel between photographs and religious icons, she presses the argument that photographic realism as the manifestation of the objects photographed has less to do with our beliefs in the epistemic status of photography than it does with our attitudes and emotions, such as the desire to sustain contact with departed people. In so far as her argument centers on portraits, whether of saints in icons or of people in photographs, it would be interesting to ask if it implies that we do not feel in contact with the non-human objects in, say, landscape photographs.

In "Photographs and Evidence," Meskin and Cohen approach realism from a different angle. They reject Walton's claim that we literally see the objects in photographs. Instead, they analyze the special epistemic status of (depictive) photographs in terms of their information content: "photographs typically provide information about many of the visually detectable properties of the objects they depict" (72). They follow Dretske in understanding that "information is carried when there is an objective, probabilistic, counterfactually supporting link between two independent events" (72). Because it is an objective link, their notion of the information carried by a photograph is independent of any subject's beliefs or other mental states. Their claim about photographic information is weaker than it might at first appear to be. Consider color: "photographs typically carry information about the color of the objects they depict -- if the colors of the objects had been different then the photographic image would have been different" (73). This concedes that the photograph does not tell the viewer what the color is; as they note, "systematically replacing the colors of a picture with their complements would not thereby change the informational content of that picture" (74). They contrast visual or v-information about the appearance of objects with information about the egocentric location of the objects they depict, which they call e-information. In their view, the special epistemic status of photography is grounded on the fact that photographs provide v-information without providing e-information, whereas ordinary seeing provides both sorts of information.

Walden's "Truth in Photography," looks at photographs as potential sources of true beliefs. He contrasts objectively formed images -- those produced mechanically, such as photographs -- with subjectively formed images, such as handmade images. He argues that "we generally have better reason to accept beliefs engendered by viewing photographic images than we do those engendered by viewing handmade ones" (104). He concludes by considering whether the wide-spread adoption of digital-imaging techniques will undermine our confidence in the objectivity (mechanical nature) of the image-forming process. He argues that it is in "our collective interests to resist the implementation of such techniques [that undermine objectivity]" (109). One reason is that even if we still form true beliefs from looking at an image, these will be less epistemically valuable if we lack grounds for confidence in their truth.

Savedoff's contribution explores what she calls the documentary authority that we ascribe to photography: we regard a photograph as capturing a bit of the actual world. She makes this key to the ways that art photographs work; whether recognizably depictive or more abstract, they depend on and play off of this authority. The effectiveness of many artistic photos depend on our taking them as factual. She shows how the irony or humor of a photograph is made more profound because we regard the scene depicted as really in the world, not constructed by the photographer. She goes on to show how artistic photographs, because of their authority as photographs, often force the viewer to disambiguate complex images and thus see the world made strange. This authority also accounts for an important distinction between abstract paintings and abstract photographs. In the latter we are enticed to play a game of identifying the actual objects photographed. In a Cubist painting "the forms refer to objects … In the case of photographs, the forms are the forms of the objects before the lens" (122).

A second group of articles revolves around Roger Scruton's position. In "Photography and Representation" Scruton couples many of the same basic facts about photography that other authors accept with his own not implausible view of what an artistic representation of the world is to conclude that photographs as such can never be artistic representations: "photography is not a representational art" (139). It should be said that he is referring to a logically ideal photography, which he defines as having a purely causal and non-intentional relation to its subject. An ideal photograph of x implies that x exists and that it is, roughly, as it appears in the photograph. Yes, there is an intentional act involved in taking the photo, but it is not an essential part of the photographic relation. The appearance of the subject, therefore, is "not interesting as the realization of an intention but rather as a record of how an actual object looked" (140). Appearances in a representational painting are a different story. "The aim of painting is to give insight, and the creation of an appearance is important mainly as the expression of thought" (148). Given how they are defined, ideal photographs cannot express thoughts. He argues that "if one finds a photograph beautiful, it is because one finds something beautiful in its subject" (152). On the other hand, in so far as the photographer manipulates the image in some way, going beyond the 'ideal' photographic process, for example in a photo-montage, she becomes a painter. So, Scruton in effect presents a dilemma for anyone who would defend the possibility of photographs as art: either a given photograph is an 'ideal' photograph and hence not an artistic representation or it is in important ways not photography but a form of painting. To answer this challenge one would have to show that the photographic process involves possibilities for expression of the artist's thought and style that lie outside of Scruton's stark options.

Articles by David Davies and Patrick Maynard follow and counter Scruton's argument by going into details of photographic composition. Davies' "How Photographs Signify" takes direct aim at Scruton's argument by developing ideas drawn from Rudolph Arnheim and Cartier-Bresson. Davies shows how the geometry of a carefully composed photograph prevents the viewer from perceiving it as a "transparent window upon its subject" and instead leads her "to see the subject in a particular way." So, contra Scruton, there is a "thought embodied in perceptual form" (182-183). Maynard ("Scales of Space and Time in Photography") presents the most detailed analysis of the various dimensions of a photograph -- negative space, dynamics, etc. -- to argue that there are "inextricable but irreducible artistic values in snapshot art." Savedoff's sensitive discussion of various genres of art photography also provides weight to the argument against Scruton.

A third theme of the collection involves comparisons between films and still photographs. Scruton inspects film's credentials to be art in spite of its being a series of photographs (an artistic defect from his point of view). Gregory Currie ("Photography and the Power of Narrative") compares the ability of still photographs and film to support a narrative. In his second contribution to the anthology, "Landscape and Still Life," Walton investigates the differences between what can be depicted in a still picture and in a moving picture. Both Walton and Currie sketch accounts of the viewer's imaginative experience to explain the difference between what can be depicted in still and moving photographs.

Noël Carroll ("The Problem with Movie Stars") notes that movie stars often bring a persona to a movie role and that this persona is sometimes essential to our understanding of the narrative of the movie. He argues that this fact is inconsistent with standard assumptions about how we should understand fictional narratives. These assumptions dictate that extra-work information about an actor is not relevant to an understanding of the fictional world of the work. The cognitive background relevant to appreciating photographs as photographs is also explored by Dominic Lopes ("True Appreciation"). He contrasts two principles of adequate appreciation in general. One drawn from the theories of nature appreciation of Allen Carlson and Malcolm Budd requires that "an appreciation of O as a K is adequate only if O is a K" (212). One's appreciation of a whale will be inadequate if one appreciates it as a fish rather than a mammal. A different principle requires that "an appreciation of O as a K is adequate only as far as it does not depend counterfactually on any belief that is inconsistent with the truth about the nature of Ks" (213). He suggests reasons to favor the latter requirement as a general principle. However, this principle implies that our aesthetic appreciation of photographs is inadequate to the degree that we find them compelling because we have false beliefs about the accuracy with which photography records how things look.

I note in conclusion that Walden provides a thorough Introduction and an extensive Bibliography. As you would expect, there are photographs (32 of them) that illustrate the arguments. There is also a substantial Index, which is a bonus in an edited book. All in all, this is a very valuable collection that gathers together a set of articles and issues that should be of general interest to philosophers of art. As an anthology of analytic philosophy of art this collection may be most appropriate for upper-division and graduate aesthetics courses, although it would also be a provocative addition to interdisciplinary courses in photographic or film theory.