Physical Relativity: Space-time Structure from a Dynamical Perspective

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Harvey R. Brown, Physical Relativity: Space-time Structure from a Dynamical Perspective, Oxford University Press, 2005, 240pp, $55 (hbk), ISBN 0199275831.

Reviewed by Bradford Skow, University of Massachusetts


Harvey Brown thinks that most philosophers are confused about relativity. Most centrally, he thinks they're confused about the relativistic effects of length contraction and time dilation. In this important book, he aims to set them straight.

Brown takes sides in a debate about the explanatory role spacetime plays. (Although Brown repeatedly expresses solidarity with those who deny that spacetime exists, all parties to this debate are substantivalists -- they accept that spacetime exists. So Brown, too, accepts this view, for purposes of his argument). According to (what Brown alleges is) the dominant view among substantivalists, the geometrical structure of Minkowski spacetime plays some role in explaining why moving rods shrink and why moving clocks run slow. Brown rejects this view. He asserts, instead, that in order to explain why moving rods shrink we must appeal to the dynamical laws governing the forces that hold the parts of the rod together. The geometry of Minkowski spacetime plays no role in this explanation.

Brown's approach is historical. He traces the view he endorses back to several physicists who worked on electromagnetism and on relativity before Einstein wrote his 1905 paper. Brown thinks their work has been underappreciated and misunderstood, and devotes space to detailed investigations of precisely who said precisely what. Then, after a look at Einstein's approach to special relativity, Brown devotes a chapter to post-Einsteinian voices on special relativity that also endorse his view. In passing, he considers the claim that in special relativity, whether two events are simultaneous (relative to just one frame of reference) is a matter of convention, and (true to the contrary spirit of the book) rejects the dominant view that it is not. The book finishes with a chapter in which Brown defends his main thesis in the context of general relativity.

There is a lot of physics in this book. It presupposes (at minimum) that the reader understands the geometry of Minkowski spacetime and its physical interpretation. Some parts of the book also presuppose knowledge of quantum mechanics and general relativity.

As I said, the main question Brown addresses is: what explanatory role, if any, does the geometry of spacetime play? To warm us up for special relativity, in chapter two Brown discusses an example, drawn from Newtonian mechanics, in which the geometry of spacetime is sometimes alleged to play an important explanatory role. Brown asks: why is Newton's first law true? Why do free bodies move on geodesics in spacetime?

Now, a substantivalist could just refuse to answer this question. (I'm making the (controversial) assumption that "Because it is a law" is not a good answer.) That's just the way things are, she might reply; explanations come to an end somewhere. In some situations this is an acceptable thing to say. Not every explanatory demand is an urgent one. If I flip a coin ten times and observe the sequence HTHHTTTHTH, we may well ask why the coin tosses resulted in that particular sequence, rather than some other. But this explanatory demand is not particularly urgent -- that the coin tosses results in that particular sequence does not "cry out" for explanation -- so we shouldn't be bothered by our inability to give a particularly satisfying explanation. However, Brown thinks that the demand to explain why Newton's first law is true is urgent. He writes that free bodies "conspire to move in straight lines" even though they cannot communicate, and remarks that "anyone who is not amazed by this conspiracy has not understood it" (15). Later he says that in Newton's theory "a kind of highly non-trivial pre-established harmony is being postulated" (17). I must admit, though, that these statements don't make the demand to explain the principle of inertia feel urgent to me. Force-free bodies have to behave in some way. If each one traced out a strange and complicated curve in spacetime, and no two bodies traced out curves of the same shape -- that would be weird, and I would want to know why. That they all behave the same way, and all move on geodesics, doesn't seem that peculiar.

Brown opposes the view that the geometry of spacetime explains why free bodies move on geodesics (24). When he briefly characterizes how (according to his opponents) the explanation is supposed to go, Brown uses causal language: free particles follow geodesics because the geodesics "somehow guide the free particles along their way" (24). And on page 26 he is explicit that his target is the view that spacetime geometry plays a causal-explanatory role. (Perhaps he thinks that the only explanatory role spacetime geometry could play is a causal one.)

Brown calls this view "very popular" and claims that Einstein believed it for a while (139). Among contemporary philosophers Brown quotes a passage from Graham Nerlich in which Nerlich expresses this view. Nerlich writes, "It is because space-time has a certain shape that worldlines lie as they do" (24). Maybe Nerlich does intend "because" here to ascribe causal powers to spacetime. But someone with more caution might simply affirm counterfactuals and remain silent about causation: if this path hadn't been a geodesic, then it would not have been the worldline of that (or any) free particle. Accepting such counterfactuals looks like a way to give the geometry of spacetime some role in explaining why free bodies behave as they do. As far as I can tell, Brown denies spacetime even this weaker explanatory role. (As I mention below, he defends the view that the "arrow of explanation" goes in the other direction. He thinks that those paths are geodesics because they are the paths of free particles.)

What are Brown's objections to the view he attributes to Nerlich? One objection is rhetorical: Brown asks how such an explanation would be any better than Moliere's appeal to opium's "dormative virtue." He also notes that it is not "in the nature" of free bodies to follow geodesics, since in general relativity spinning free bodies do not do so (24; 141). Perhaps this is meant to block attempts to explain the law of inertia by claiming that the law is (metaphysically) necessary.

Later in the book Brown turns to explanations of length contraction and time dilation in special relativity. There are many things I might be asking when I ask someone to explain length contraction. I might be asking, "Why do different inertial observers (who are not at relative rest) disagree about the length of a given (inertially moving) rod?" Or I might be asking, "Why is a moving rod shorter than its stationary counterpart (of the same proper length)?" Or I might be asking, "If you take a rod that is initially at rest (in your frame of reference), and accelerate it, why is it shorter after you accelerate it than it was before you accelerated it?"

Most introductory treatments of the geometry of Minkowski spacetime contain answers to the first two of these why-questions. These explanations make no assumptions about the kinds of particles composing the rod or the nature of the forces holding those particles together. They instead explain these phenomena in geometrical terms. (With regard to the first question, for example, they say that when the different observers measure "the" length of the rod they actually measure the spatiotemporal interval between two different pairs of spacetime points.)

I'm not sure what Brown thinks about geometrical answers to the first why-question, but he certainly thinks that geometrical answers to the second two why-questions are bad explanations. He thinks that good answers to these questions say something about the way in which the forces holding the parts of the rod together depend on velocity of the rod. Only that is a story of what causes the particles to get closer together, and so what causes the rod to shrink.

Brown's opponents think that these causal explanations are available, but (presumably) think that those explanations "miss the forest for the trees." They will say that we can explain why moving rods shrink and moving clocks slow down without knowing anything about the particular details of the dynamical laws governing their behavior. Whatever the dynamical laws turn out to be, those laws will be Lorentz invariant. And as long as the laws are Lorentz invariant, it will be a consequence of those laws that moving rods shrink (assuming that the laws allow for matter stable enough to constitute measuring rods). And the laws are Lorentz invariant because spacetime has a Minkowski geometry, and the symmetries of the laws must match those of the spacetime geometry. The geometry of spacetime explains length contraction because it places constraints on the structure of the dynamical laws.

This last claim is key, and it is the one that Brown disputes. Among his arguments that the geometry of spacetime does not explain why the laws are Lorentz invariant are these. First, Brown catalogues several geometrical structures that play a role in some physical theory or other, and claims that no one thinks that those geometrical structures do any explanatory work. For example, no one thinks that the geometry of configuration space for an N-body system in classical mechanics plays any role in explaining why that system evolves as it does (section 8.2). Second, he notes that many of his opponents admit that it is metaphysically possible that the symmetries of the laws not match the symmetries of the spacetime geometry (143). He seems to think that this admission shows that the geometry of Minkowski spacetime cannot explain why the dynamical laws are Lorentz invariant.

I have some doubts about these two arguments. Regarding the first: configuration space is an abstract space we use in our theories for representational purposes; why think that its failure to explain anything casts doubt on the ability of real physical space(time) to explain anything? (Brown thinks that this reply is question begging (139), but I don't see why.) Regarding the second: even if it is a contingent fact that the symmetries of spacetime and the symmetries of the laws match, the first may play some role in explaining the second. Spacetime geometry may explain why the dynamical symmetries are as they are because it is a (contingent) law of nature (a second-order law governing the first-order dynamical laws) that the two sets of symmetries match. (Brown mentions this view in section 8.4.1, but I can't tell what he thinks is wrong with it.)

Brown suggests an alternative way of thinking about spacetime geometry. He thinks that the "arrow of explanation" should go the other way: we should "consider absolute space-time structure as a codification of certain key aspects of the behavior of particles" (24-25; also see page 142). It's not entirely clear to me what this means. Perhaps Brown's claim is that the explanation I proposed in the previous paragraph is exactly backwards. Instead, he thinks that (in special relativity) spacetime has a Minkowski geometry because the dynamical laws are Lorentz invariant. The geometry, in some sense, depends on the structure of the laws.

Obviously, the symmetries of the laws do not cause spacetime to have a certain geometrical structure. So what kind of explanation is this? Maybe Brown thinks that the symmetries of the laws explain why spacetime has the structure it does because the spacetime metric is somehow analyzed in terms of the laws. In several places his discussion suggests that, on his view, a field only gets to be the metric field when the dynamics prescribe that material bodies behave in the right sort of way with respect to it (see, for example, pages 100 and 160). Compare this to a Reichenbachian view according to which distance between points of space is analyzed in terms of the behavior of measuring rods -- though Brown rejects this view (23), his view does seem to resemble it: both of them make spacetime geometry an extrinsic matter. (Brown's apparent denial that spacetime geometry is "self-standing" and "autonomous" looks like a denial that it is intrinsic (143).)

This is an intriguing alternative view about the nature of geometry. It should be taken seriously by anyone interested in the topic, and Brown's book will be the place to look for its articulation and defense.