Physical Theory: Method and Interpretation

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Lawrence Sklar (ed.), Physical Theory: Method and Interpretation, Oxford University Press, 2015, 293pp., $65.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780195145649.

Reviewed by Kent W. Staley, Saint Louis University


This informative and stimulating volume comprises nine original essays by ten of the most significant contributors to current philosophical debates regarding physical theory. Lawrence Sklar divides the essays into two parts: "Scientific Method" (six chapters) and "Foundations of Physics" (three chapters). In this review I will say a little about the book itself before turning to discussion of the individual chapters.

The topics covered call to mind the early volumes of Minnesota Studies in the Philosophy of Science. There is breadth (with chapters ranging from the foundations of quantum field theory to the characterization of scientific progress), yet the problems considered lie along well traveled currents in the mainstream tradition of philosophy of physical science. This is the stuff of PSA meetings, not of the Society for the Philosophy of Science in Practice. This is not intended as a criticism; the tradition deserves continuing, as these essays do in an exemplary manner. Those seeking to pursue entirely novel questions, deeply historical investigations, or problems with an explicit connection to matters of policy will have to look elsewhere.

My one criticism of the volume as a whole is that the chapters are not altogether consistent in the level at which they approach their subjects and in their manner of treatment, making it difficult to say exactly who is the intended audience or what is the intended use of the volume. The details of the discrepancies will emerge in the discussion of the individual chapters. For now, let the following observation regarding two adjacent chapters suffice. The sophisticated yet non-technical treatment in John Norton's chapter about the ontology of space and time makes it entirely appropriate to assign to undergraduates in an upper-level course. The chapter that follows, by Laura Ruetsche on "QM", would be nearly impenetrable to someone who is fairly new to philosophical debates regarding quantum mechanics. (I hasten to add that the effort is well rewarded, for reasons elaborated below.)

Next I will briefly characterize the book's nine chapters, with some critical comments regarding a few of them.

In "Scientific Explanation," James Woodward provides a concise and lucid overview, somewhat in the manner of an encyclopedia entry, of the literature on this subject. He surveys the most important models of scientific explanation, starting with Deductive-Nomological and Inductive-Statistical models before turning to Statistical Relevance and Causal/Mechanical models and the Unificationist model advanced first by Michael Friedman and revised by Philip Kitcher. Woodward articulates clearly the motivations for each account, as well as the difficulties they face.

A conclusion on "directions for future work" contrasts the view from an orientation toward fundamental physics with that directed toward biology or the social sciences. One issue concerns the relevance of causes to explanation. For philosophers concerned with the connections between the susceptibility of phenomena to manipulation and the causal explanation of those phenomena, the DN model's indifference to causal asymmetries is a glaring weakness. But if, as some have argued, such notions of causation have no place in fundamental physics, then this indifference "may look like a virtue . . . or at least not a serious defect" (33). Woodward calls for a "better understanding of the legitimate role (if any) that causal considerations play in fundamental physics" (34). Another concern relates to the relevance of laws to explanation. Fundamental physics relies on principles that many regard as exemplary natural laws. But whether there are laws in biology or the social sciences, and if so, what they are, is unsettled. The absence of a "compelling account of what laws are" means, Woodward argues, that we lack an account of why laws are needed for explanation. Advocates of law-based accounts of explanation should seek, therefore, to give an integrated account that tells us both what laws are and why explanations require them.

Focusing on the philosophical challenges posed by probabilistic explanations, Michael Strevens identifies three reasons for relying on probabilities when explaining phenomena. First, the processes underlying the phenomenon may be indeterministic. Second, we might lack sufficient knowledge of the processes underlying the phenomenon to explain it deterministically. Finally, although the phenomenon might come about in a number of ways that differ in their details, we may give an explanation that, abstracting away the determining details, shows how the phenomenon results under different possible circumstances. Any satisfactory account of probabilistic explanation must make sense of the value of probabilistic explanations in each of these cases, or make it clear why it is a mistake to value such explanations. Strevens surveys Hempel's Inductive-Statistical account, causal approaches, and statistical relevance approaches to probabilistic explanation, as well as debates over the size of the probability attached to the event to be explained and over changes in that probability. Finally, he turns to the problematic status of probabilistic explanation in the case of deterministic processes. Building upon Peter Railton's work, Strevens emphasizes the explanatory value of probability concepts as a means of both characterizing and understanding the robustness of an event kind (i.e., the way in which the kind of event to be explained comes about given a broad range of possible initial conditions).

Marc Lange begins "Laws of Nature," by noting how the traditional approach to thinking about such laws places them in the odd position of constituting "contingent necessities" lying between "accidental" facts and facts "that absolutely could not have been otherwise" (63). Lange surveys several distinct but related investigations regarding laws of nature, including the relationship between laws and counterfactuals, the nature of nomic necessity, the dispute between "best systems" and "nomic necessitarian" accounts, and more. This is a tricky tangle of topics to sort out in thirty pages, and many vexed issues fly by rather quickly. But some passages illuminate the reader surprisingly efficiently, and Lange usefully gives a brief but helpful introduction to his own attempt to make sense of the "contingent necessity" of natural laws in terms of the notion of stability. Roughly, a stable set of truths is one each member of which would remain true under every counterfactual supposition that is logically consistent with all members of that set. Lange argues that the only stable set of truths containing an accidental truth is the trivial one consisting of all truths whatsoever. The set of all necessities (logical, mathematical, metaphysical, conceptual, and nomic) is however non-trivially stable. The set of necessities excluding the natural laws is a stable subset of the stable set of all necessities. Lange briskly concludes that stability "allows us to capture the sense in which the laws are . . . necessary but not as necessary as the logical, conceptual, mathematical, and metaphysical necessities" (72).

In "Reading Nature," P. Kyle Stanford discusses the ongoing debates between scientific realists and instrumentalists about scientific theory, with particular attention to what he calls "quietism." The disputes between realists and instrumentalists are well documented in countless other publications. I would like to draw attention to Stanford's characterization of quietism and his defense of instrumentalism. Stanford's quietist regards the enterprise of attempting to interpret scientific theories as "misguided" (108). The paradigmatic quietist position is Arthur Fine's Natural Ontological Attitude (NOA). NOA's attempt to disengage from the project of philosophically inflating the scientific enterprise receives a sympathetic treatment from Stanford in the face of Alan Musgrave's critique alleging that NOA ultimately fails in this attempt. But, he argues, NOA remains committed to the existence of a genuine distinction between realism and instrumentalism, though it refuses to commit to either side of that distinction. This, Stanford argues, puts NOA in the same boat as the realist and the instrumentalist: they all must face the argument that no coherent distinction can be drawn between realism and instrumentalism. Both Howard Stein and Simon Blackburn have argued that once one has articulated adequately nuanced versions of realism and instrumentalism, taking into account both the pragmatic dimensions of epistemic commitment and the multifarious reliance on theory implicated in the instrumentalist "use" of theories, the idea that one might entertain two different views about the interpretation of scientific theories will be revealed as spurious.

Stanford, however, argues that the instrumentalist attitude he advocates is "a difference that makes a difference" (121) when compared to realism. What is that difference? According to Stanford, the realist will use "relativity and not Newtonian mechanics" when small errors will be costly or when attempting to extend inquiry into "new parts of the relevant domain." But "the instrumentalist can do none of this;" she must "use a theoretical instrument she does not believe to be true when she makes predictions" no matter how costly the error (121). Of course, the theories used in either case are the same; only the attributed attitudes toward those theories seem different. Stanford's attributions, however, employ the standard vocabulary ("believe to be true," "use as a theoretical instrument") of the realist/instrumentalist dispute. Stanford does not explain what warrants this use in light of the critiques of Stein and Blackburn.

Stanford draws one contrast between instrumentalists and realists that would constitute a real, practical difference: "we should expect the instrumentalist to be much more open than her realist counterpart to the serious exploration of fundamentally distinct alternatives to her best current scientific theories" (123). But Stanford's reasoning on this point is suspect, because he assumes that the only thing that would make such exploration reasonable for a realist is "her judgment that it is only probable that her best current theory is true," making the investment of resources in such exploration reasonable only in proportion to the probability (presumably small for the realist) of that theory being false. This assumption is dubious. Physicists testing gravity theories, for example, construct alternatives to General Relativity not on the basis of judgments about the probability of that theory being false, but simply on the grounds that doing so facilitates learning more about the evidence that is relevant to that theory (Will 1993, Mayo 2010, Staley 2014). Realists and instrumentalists alike should be able to share such an interest.

A different aspect of the interpretive project is the target of the critique brought by Simon Saunders and Kerry McKenzie in "Structure and Logic." They are concerned specifically with "structuralism as implemented through theory reformulation in formal logic and set theory" (127). Their ambitious chapter charts the history of attempts to lay out a philosophical program for such interpretation. They undertake this whirlwind historical tour in the service of their bluntly stated thesis that the kind of structuralism under discussion "is at a dead end" (128). It is hardly possible to undertake such an argument without introducing a certain degree of formalism, if only to introduce the Ramsey sentence apparatus. Saunders and McKenzie seem to have tried to minimize this obstacle to the novice reader, but their chapter does mark a slight escalation in the technical sophistication demanded of the reader.

A triviality argument due to Maxwell Newman (that a structural interpretation of a theory renders only questions of cardinality subject to empirical investigation) appears early in the chapter, joined later by another triviality argument due to Hilary Putnam. Saunders and McKenzie deploy these and other arguments to articulate a kind of naturalistic quietism of their own: "there is no metaperspective available, no overarching formal system in which intertheoretical relationships can be classified and displayed other than that provided by the sciences themselves" (157).

Jarrett Leplin's "Evolution and Revolution in Science" rejects both of two competing models of scientific change. The obvious foil for Leplin is Thomas Kuhn, who invoked both evolution and revolution in The Structure of Scientific Revolutions. According to Leplin, evolutionary models depict scientific change in terms of "continuous growth," underwriting a view of science as progressing. Revolutionary models, on the other hand, treat scientific change as a "disruptive substitution of radically divergent perspectives that resist epistemic comparison" (163). Leplin considers general (not necessarily Darwinian) evolutionary models, according to which scientific change is guided by "general principles that explain its later stages on the basis of earlier stages" (168). However, no general principles with sufficient specificity to support the requisite explanations seem to be forthcoming, and the prospects for finding such do not seem bright. Leplin thus turns to revolutionary models. Leplin here relies on a characterization of revolutionary models that explicitly depicts change as "essentially political." The political characterization invoked here is not obviously demanded by Leplin's initial description of revolution as disruptive substitution that resists epistemic characterization. Kuhn invoked political revolutions as an analogy to help motivate and highlight important features of his account of revolutionary change. (Darwinian evolution, too, was for Kuhn simply an analogy that "can easily be pushed too far" (Kuhn 1996, 172).)

Leplin claims that because scientific change does not follow projectable patterns it cannot be evolutionary. Because changes in theory can be supported with reasons and successor theories can explain both the successes and failures of predecessor theories, science is too cumulative to be revolutionary. Rationality does receive greater emphasis in Leplin's account than in Kuhn's, but a more precise comparison of their models would require elaboration of the concept of rationality that Leplin intends to invoke as well as an untangling of the significant differences between their uses of the terminology of evolution and revolution.

The final three chapters all concern issues in fundamental physics. John Norton asks "What Can We Learn about the Ontology of Space and Time from the Theory of Relativity?" His lively discussion aims to clear up misunderstandings about the ontological implications of relativity theory, some of them rather widespread. It would be entirely suitable for a wider readership. To the extent that an understanding of relativity theory contributes to basic scientific literacy, Norton's essay could bring greater lucidity and accuracy to the broader public understanding of physics.

Norton imposes four requirements to constrain possible ontological morals from relativity theory. Novelty requires that they should not be derivable from pre-relativistic theories. Modesty requires that they be actual consequences (and not, say, mere suggestions) of the theory. Realism calls for a maximally literal interpretation of the theory. Robustness is invoked to block consequences of special relativity that do not survive the transition to general relativity. The relativity of simultaneity fails robustness. What is robust, and forms a central theme of the chapter, is the closely related entanglement of space and time, the explanation of which requires consideration of infinitesimal neighborhoods of events, which mimic in general relativity the relativity of simultaneity manifested in entire spacetimes in special relativity. The ensuing discussion of issues such as the hole argument and the geometrization of force exemplifies how one can discuss difficult scientific questions understandably without obfuscation. Norton ends the essay with a debunking of several dubious morals of relativity theory, the most interesting of which are those, such as "the relativity of geometry," that are derivable from pre-relativistic theories and hence fail the novelty requirement.

Perhaps the fact that the title of Laura Ruetsche's chapter is about five times more difficult to type if you are not using LaTeX is a warning shot to the unwary casual reader. "QM" is concerned with the interpretive "anxieties" brought on by the fact that quantum field theories (QFTs) and theories of quantum statistical mechanics (QSM) in the thermodynamic limit (all of which Ruetsche subsumes under the label QM) admit infinitely many physically inequivalent Hilbert space representations. Thanks to the Stone-von Neumann uniqueness theorem, theories of ordinary quantum mechanics (QM) do not suffer from this problem. After Ruetsche explains the uniqueness theorem as it applies to ordinary QM and shows how it fails in QM, she raises the central question of her essay: "how do theories of QM characterize and individuate physical possibilities?" (241). The surface simplicity of the question belies the complications and subtleties of the possible answers that receive consideration. I can produce no adequate brief characterization of the landscape of views considered, but what turns out to be at stake is a view of physical theory that Ruetsche calls "the modal toggle picture." According to that view, "a physical theory sorts logically possible worlds into those that are (according to its kinematics) physically possible and those that are not" (265). Several plausible approaches to the interpretation of theories in QM require abandoning the modal toggle picture of physical theory, allowing "nonkinematic particulars" to play a role in the configuration of the set of worlds that are possible according to the theory. Although Ruetsche herself does not emphasize it, this result is a bracing challenge to the idea that the nature of the philosophical enterprise itself can be brought as an a priori element to the study of scientific knowledge. Perhaps more carefully: Ruetsche's essay should lead us to doubt that we already know (or can extra-scientifically figure out) what theories are supposed to do, and that we need only study particular scientific theories in order to learn how they do it.

The last, and briefest, word goes to the editor. Lawrence Sklar's "Statistical Mechanics in Physical Theory" gives a concise, even breezy, introduction to a cluster of topics surrounding statistical mechanics. I do not know whether Sklar's own essay should be taken to indicate his intentions for the volume as a whole. If so, the other contributors mostly departed, in some cases significantly, from the editor's example, and not only in terms of word count. The essay appropriately emphasizes the contributions of Boltzmann and Maxwell to the development of statistical mechanics, the importance and limitations of ergodic theory, and various attempts to solve the problem of time asymmetry in thermodynamics. Sklar gives a nice summary of Boltzmann's attempt to address the time asymmetry problem as well as later efforts to improve upon Boltzmann. The discussion is unburdened by references to the literature, but Sklar does provide a concluding paragraph listing further readings, which his essay will make you want to pursue.

Although the essays in this collection vary somewhat in their approaches, the breadth of topics covered and the numerous insights on offer make it a volume that a wide variety of philosophers of science would certainly benefit from reading and using in their teaching.


Mayo, Deborah. 2010. "Error, Severe Testing, and the Growth of Theoretical Knowledge." In Deborah G. Mayo and Aris Spanos (eds.), Error and Inference: Recent Exchanges on Experimental Reasoning, Reliability, and the Objectivity and Rationality of Science. New York: Cambridge University Press, pp. 28-57.

Staley, Kent. 2014. "Experimental Knowledge in the Face of Theoretical Error." In Marcel Boumans, Giora Hon, and Arthur C. Petersen (eds.), Error and Uncertainty in Scientific Practice. London: Pickering and Chatto, pp. 39-55.

Will, Clifford. 1993. Theory and Experiment in Gravitational Physics. Revised edition. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.