Physicalism and Its Discontents

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Gillett, Carl and Loewer, Barry (eds.), Physicalism and Its Discontents, Cambridge University Press, 2001, 380pp, $60.00 (hbk), ISBN 0-521-80175-3.

Reviewed by Bernard Linsky, University of Alberta


This is a collection of previously unpublished essays on the metaphysics of mind, on physicalism and its alternatives. No one these days objects to physicalism on the grounds that there is a separate mental substance, derisively nicknamed “ectoplasm” by those in the field. What the “discontents” advocate instead is only one of several varieties of property dualism which somehow still holds that basically the world is physical. One prominent variant is to argue that while mental properties are distinct from physical properties, they nevertheless supervene on them. This might be because the physical properties are the “realizers” of the proper functional role or in some other way constitute the higher level states. The greatest number of the articles in this book criticize these alternatives, claiming that supervenience is somehow untenable, or that in fact it is compatible with physicalism. The less popular alternative to physicalism is to argue that there is simply no contact between mental properties, attributed by psychological theorizing, or “folk psychology”, and the properties of physical theory. The other part of the defense of physicalism, then, is to attack this view. These defenses of physicalism are generally sweeping, handling several sorts of resistance at one time, lumping them together a bit more than one would like.

Part II, titled “Physicalist Discontents”, contains defensive replies to physicalist arguments, insisting that functional or other higher level properties might well enter into causal relations and be legitimate parts of the physical world, without having to be seen as reduced or reducible to lower level physical properties. There are no Cartesian dualists, and indeed only the faintest hint of epiphenomenalism. Everyone in this section pays some lip service to physicalism, yet still resists. Perhaps the book would better be titled Reductive Physicalism and Its Discontents.

Part III, called “Physicalism and Consciousness: A Continuing Dialectic” begins with the only papers in the collection that present independent objections to physicalism rather than reactive responses to physicalist arguments. Jaegwon Kim’s contribution clearly lays down the challenge to physicalism, and indeed ought to be read first in the whole collection. It sets out Kim’s current position, and repeats his influential formulation of the “problem of mental causation”, namely that supervenient mental properties would be causally idle in a world where all causation is achieved in the physical base. The lingering problem for physicalism is still qualia and conscious experience. Causally mysterious, at best epiphenomenal, mental properties may still be needed to satisfy our intuitions about inverted spectra and zombies.

The other positive argument against physicalism is based on the conceivability and allegedly consequent possibility of physical properties not being identical with mental properties. This argument originated with Saul Kripke’s Naming and Necessity. Colin McGinn presents a new variant of this argument making the distinction between properties and our concepts of them, about which there is some back and forth in two successive articles. The volume concludes with a criticism of David Chalmers’ version of the Kripke argument. What follows is a listing of articles and a brief description of what each attempts.

This summary is organized by the section titles used by the editors, revealing that perhaps a different organization might have given a better structure to the whole. It is possible to dip into this book, as it does not present a sustained argument leading to a conclusion. Indeed it might have been better if the job of replying to various anti-reductivist views were parceled out among the contributors a bit more. Some repeat each other or lump views together and consequently don’t go into the depth that might be desired. (Thus Witmer writes “…my motivations for looking at supervenience have nothing to do with avoiding reductionism, whatever that is.” (p. 59) There is a tone of battling programs here rather than detailed argument and reply. It would be best to read the Kim article first, then go to what seems interesting from a look at the titles, and only then sit down to read the volume through in sequence.

Part I: Physicalism

David Papineau, “The Rise of Physicalism”, investigates the history of what he sees as a fairly recent doctrine, that all physical events have sufficient physical causes. Papineau argues that this view was not a necessary consequence of physics until the rise of conservation principles for energy and momentum in the 19th century left no room for non-physical causes of physical events. This paper is one of the few that goes into detail about the actual content of physicalism. Most begin with one of a variety of one-line characterizations variously saying that all spatiotemporal phenomena are caused or explained by physical properties or laws.

Barry Loewer, “From Physics to Physicalism”, introduces many of the issues of the volume by arguing that physicalism does not commit one to various allegedly disastrous consequences. Thus physicalism does not require that all sciences be reducible to physics, or that all laws or properties be reducible to physical laws and properties. Similarly, physicalism does not rule out mental causation, at least when causation is analyzed counterfactually in the style of David Lewis. Nor does physicalism lead to an emergentist view of the mental. While perhaps intended as an introductory survey of the issues of the volume, in fact the formulations of the results of some debates and the reliance on a prior understanding of a number of issues discussed in the other contributions might have made this article serve better as a conclusion, summarizing one editor’s view of the score card at the end of the discussions. This article should at least be read after Kim’s, for those unfamiliar with the issues of mental causation and supervenience.

D. Gene Witmer, “Sufficiency Claims and Physicalism: A Formulation”, progresses through a series of refined formulations of the notion of supervenience, each revealing a crucial part of the notion. The sixth, ultimate, version, (S6) is: “Any physically possible world that is a minimal physical duplicate of the actual world is indiscernible from it in all respects.” This must be supplemented with another condition (LE2) placed on the laws that obtain in related worlds and even so we are short of conditions sufficient for the explanation of all by the physical facts.

Sydney Shoemaker, “Realization and Mental Causation”, argues, against George Bealer, that functional properties can be causally efficacious in a way that their “realizers” cannot. (Pain as a functional state defined by certain characteristic causes and effects, which may be distinct from the causes and effects of the physical state, such as C-fiber firing that in fact has, or “realizes”, that functional role in our brains.)

Georges Rey, “Physicalism and Psychology: A Plea for a Substantive Philosophy of Mind”, first criticizes various claims that psychology is not compatible with physicalism. These claims are the supposed “insularity” of folk-psychology, that folk explanations of behavior are adequate and indeed incapable of correction from scientific study, that genuine laws in psychology are impossible, hence that folk explanations are all that is possible, and that folk explanations have a normative element, attributing rationality to believers, that has no counterpart in physicalistic, scientific explanations. Along the way there are replies to Wittgenstein, Nagel, Hornsby, Lewis, Davidson and Quine, all of whom have espoused various parts of these views. The positive view that Rey’s then goes on to sketch might be described as a “scientific” rather than “folk” functionalism, what he calls the “computational/representational theory of thought” (CRTT) which identifies the computational processes in a mental syntax which is independent of its representational features. This makes room for the empirical study of an internal psychology independently of whatever normative or folk explanations we might give of behavior.

Howard Robinson, “Davidson and Nonreductive Materialism: A Tale of Two Cultures”, rehearses two reductive projects in psychology, behaviorism and functionalism, and compares that reduction with the reduction in the physical sciences, such as that between chemistry and physics. This reveals how there might not be a reduction of psychological laws to physical laws even though one is still a physicalist about the mind.

Noa Latham, “Substance Physicalism”, explains why there is no substance dualism any more, only property dualism. The key is an investigation of the possible intrinsic properties that mental substance might have. We now see the reasons behind the universal rejection of ectoplasm.

Stephen Leeds, “Possibility: Physical and Metaphysical”, rounds out the defenders of physicalism. The Kripke argument against physicalism relies on the apparent possibility of mind without body. Leeds’ article, by analyzing metaphysical possibility as a form of conceivable physical possibility, undercuts that argument.

Part II: Physicalist Discontents

Scott Sturgeon, “The Roots of Reductionism”, argues that the notion of reduction used in the debates is not correct, and thus supplies objections to Kim’s causal overdetermination arguments. In particular he challenges the thesis that If C causes E and E constitutes E*, then C causes E*. In a striking, though perhaps contentious example, he claims that “spin” is both a basic property, when in subatomic particles, yet derived, or reducible, when present in medium sized physical objects such as balls. (The contention is of course over whether this is the same property in both cases.)

Tim Crane, “The Significance of Emergence”, argues for a non-reductive physicalism that revives the notion of emergence, which is distinguished from supervenience, and related to a British tradition of emergentist thinking.

Carl Gillet, “The Methodological Role of Physicalism: A Minimal Skepticism”, considers the argument for physicalism which holds that we ought to use the methods of successful science and that successful science is always physicalist. He suggests that by looking at some uses of the invocation of physicalism in philosophy, such as in criticism of Tarski’s theory of truth by Field, or Minsky and Pappert’s early criticisms of connectionism, no one ever considered non-physicalist alternatives. The invocation of physicalism is a curious move in philosophy, and doesn’t carry over in a straightforward way to the study of mind.

Gary Gates, “Physicalism, Empiricism, and Positivism”, traces the origins of “physicalism”, the term being coined by Carnap and Neurath, in the debates in the Vienna Circle. The term expressed the intention that protocol sentences were to report the placement of properties at spacetime points. It was over the detailed nature of protocol reports that they differed, Carnap using a phenomenal language, and Neurath a physical object language. Seen in the context of this debate the current “thesis” of physicalism seems more like an unfulfilled project than an obvious starting point. If what we are trying to do is unify our experience and communicate it so that science is possible, then it would seem that all phenomena, psychological as well as physical, must be included from the start in all our discourse. This slightly woolly article is not openly discontent with physicalism, but rather makes the position strange by placing it in its historical context. Other editors might have placed this with the Papineau article as a discussion of the history of physicalism as a doctrine.

Part III: Physicalism And Consciousness: A Continuing Dialectic

Arguments for Pessimism

Jaegwon Kim “Mental Causation and Consciousness: The Two Mind-Body Problems for the Physicalist”, clearly lays out his well-known “causal exclusion” principle and the accompanying argument against the “downward causation” of supervenient mental properties. A mental state M, which supervenes on a physical state P, cannot cause either a mental state M* or the physical state P* upon which M* supervenes without causally overdetermining P*, which already has a sufficient cause in P. Thus, this argument, which several of the earlier papers in the collection refer to, claims that only a reductive form of physicalism is defensible. The second Mind-Body “problem” of Kim’s title, however, is that it doesn’t seem that qualia can be so reduced. Although it is not explicitly stated in the paper, the result is that Kim is left with qualia as epiphenomena, causally inert results of the real physical goings on.

Colin McGinn, “How Not to Solve the Mind-Body Problem”, begins the second, topic of this collection, the “Kripke” argument that mind-body identity statements cannot be both informative and true. McGinn suggests that introducing a notion of distinct mental or physical “conceptions” of a single mind-brain property such as pain-C-fiber-firing, doesn’t help. Ultimately the only solution will be a change in our mental concepts, which does allow it to be a conceptual or analytic truth that pain is the firing of C fibers. Only that will allow physicalism to triumph.

Terence Horgan and John Tienson, “Deconstructing New Wave Materialism”, discuss these attempts to answer the Kripke arguments using the notion of concept versus property that McGinn also dismisses. Such attempts are characteristic of what Horgan and Tienson call the “new wave” materialists. They argue, against the new wave, that concepts of mental properties represent those properties as they are, and if they do not present them as physical, they are not physical.

Optimistic Rejoinders

Brian P. McLaughlin responds in his contribution, “In Defense of New Wave Materialism”. His reply to Horgan and Tienson is to find a fallacy in their argument, claiming that while mental concepts do not represent mental properties as physical that does not mean that they represent them as non-physical.

Andrew Melnyk, “Physicalism Unfalsified: Chalmers’ Inconclusive Conceivability Argument”, concludes the volume with a response to David Chalmers’ version of the Kripke argument. Chalmers distinguishes two notions of possibility in order to present his version of the conceivability argument. In knowing the meaning of a term, Chalmers says, we have knowledge of both what that term would refer to in different circumstances (one of the senses of possibility), and given what it does in fact refer to, what it then designates with respect to different possible worlds (the other sort of possibility). Melnyk responds that a proper theory of word meaning, which invokes a Fodor-style theory of concepts, reveals that we do not have the knowledge that Chalmers’ argument requires.

This quick précis of the articles shows that the book really has two different parts, one on reductive versus non-reductive physicalism, another on the Kripke-style arguments. The division of the collection, which even splits the one exchange into different (successive) sections, detracts from the effect of the book, making it look like more of a haphazard collection than it is. In fact, this is a survey of the very latest thinking on the metaphysics of mind, covering Kim’s views on supervenience, the issues of functionalism and realizers, reduction and emergence, folk psychology and Davidson’s anomalous monism, and the Kripke-Chalmers arguments against identity theories. This volume gives the latest word on all these topics and, while perhaps not the only source for some of these views, is a place where they can all be found together.