Physicalism, Or Something Near Enough

Placeholder book cover

Jaegwon Kim, Physicalism, Or Something Near Enough, Princeton University Press, 2005, 200pp, $26.95 (hbk), ISBN 0691113750.

Reviewed by Andrew Melnyk, University of Missouri, Columbia


This book consists of six chapters, four of which are versions of material that can be found elsewhere. For three reasons, however, the book is essential reading for any philosopher with a serious interest in the metaphysics of mind: first, after several decades of often rather diffident reflection on the mind-body problem, Kim, our most distinguished metaphysician of mind, finally tells us, courteously but firmly, his considered view of the matter; secondly, that view swims against the prevailing tide by rejecting physicalism; thirdly, one of the new chapters (ch.5) is, in my opinion, of outstanding interest. I turn at once to critical discussion of this stimulating and enjoyable book's most important (though not its only important) line of thought.

Although each chapter is meant to be (and is) capable of being read alone, the six chapters are also meant to fit together to constitute a sustained argument for Kim's main conclusion. That conclusion is that physicalism about the mind is false but very nearly true: it's probably true of propositional attitudes, but almost certainly false of phenomenal properties (i.e., qualia). Kim's case for the positive part of this conclusion (about the attitudes) is rather jejune, however, and so I will quickly pass it by. Its core is the claim that propositional attitudes must be functionally reducible because it would be incoherent not to ascribe propositional attitudes to systems functionally and behaviorally indistinguishable to us (p. 165; this and all subsequent page references are to Kim's book unless stated otherwise). But the literature already contains conceivable cases (e.g., Peacocke's Martian marionette and perhaps Block's Blockhead) that contradict this claim, and Kim does not discuss them. So I doubt philosophers who worry that the original intentionality of propositional attitudes resists physicalist analysis will find anything in this book to persuade them otherwise.

Kim's case for the non-physical character of phenomenal properties, on the other hand, is full of interest. A key part of that case (pp. 5-6) can be expressed in skeletal form as the following argument:

(1) Mental properties can be causally efficacious only if they are functionally reducible to the physical.

(2) A property is functionally reducible to the physical only if it has an a priori accessible functional definition, i.e., as the property of having some or other property that performs a certain causal task.

(3) Phenomenal properties don't have a priori accessible functional definitions.


(4) Phenomenal properties aren't functionally reducible to the physical, and aren't causally efficacious.

This argument can only be part of Kim's case, however, because its conclusion, (4), doesn't quite say that physicalism is false of phenomenal properties: perhaps phenomenal properties are functionally irreducible to the physical, as (4) says, and yet stand in some weaker relation to the physical that nonetheless suffices for their physicalistic acceptability. But, unless I am very much mistaken, Kim never explains how to take the extra step from (4) to the falsity of physicalism, even though he surely takes it. Here is one passage in which the step is taken:

So qualia are not functionalizable, and hence physically irreducible. Qualia, therefore, are the "mental residue" that cannot be accommodated within the physical domain. This means that global physicalism is untenable. (p. 170)

And here is another:

Intrinsic qualities of qualia are not functionalizable and therefore are irreducible, and hence causally impotent. They stay outside the physical domain … (p. 173)

Speculation about what inference Kim had in mind in these passages is impeded by the fact that, again unless I am very much mistaken, he never gives an explicit account of what it would take for a mental property to "be accommodated within the physical domain", i.e., to be physicalistically acceptable. However, he does remark (without commentary) that physicalism entails that "any phenomenon of the world can be physically explained if it can be explained at all" (p. 150). So perhaps Kim intends us to combine (4) with the following further premises:

(5) A seemingly non-physical property can be accommodated within the physical domain only if its instances can be physically explained if they can be explained at all.

(6) The instances of a seemingly non-physical property can be physically explained only if the property is functionally reducible to the physical.

(7) Phenomenal properties are seemingly non-physical, and their instances can be explained.

For (4), (5), (6), and (7) do entail that phenomenal properties can't be accommodated within the physical domain.

However, what I really want to discuss in this review is the argument consisting of claims (1) through (4). Kim's defense of (3) is, as he acknowledges, familiar stuff: he endorses well-known arguments of Joe Levine and David Chalmers (p. 162; but he rejects zombies as incoherent on p. 169), and points out the conceivability both of itches playing the causal role of pains and of qualia inversion for sensory qualia (pp. 27 and 168-70).

Kim's case for claim (1) takes up a large part of his first chapter and all of his second; it refines a line of argument familiar from his previous work, and has the form of a reductio (p. 54). It begins by assuming the causal efficacy of the mental and then, with the help of other premises, generates a contradiction. The other premises are the supervenience of the mental on the physical, the causal closure of the physical, a causal exclusion principle (see below), and the irreducibility of mental properties to physical properties. It is, of course, the irreducibility of mental properties to physical properties that is singled out as the target of the reductio. Now Kim explicitly says (pp. 34 and 42, note 9) that a mental property M is irreducible to any physical property iff it's not (even) true that instances of the mental property are identical with instances of any physical property. So Kim's conclusion at this stage is that if mental properties are causally efficacious, then instances of mental properties must be physically reducible in the sense of being identical with instances of physical properties; no weaker relation will do.

Let me pause in my exposition to answer three questions. First question: is Kim right that (token) identity is required for the causal efficacy of the mental? I think not. I hold (and have argued elsewhere) that it suffices for the causal efficacy of the mental if mental property-instances are realized by physical property-instances, in a precise sense of "realized" that doesn't require identity between the mental and physical property-instances (see Melnyk 2003, Ch. 4). Kim's argument to the contrary errs in its uncritical acceptance of the following causal exclusion principle:

No single event can have more than one sufficient cause occurring at any given time -- unless it is a genuine case of causal overdetermination. (p. 42)

For this principle seems false. For example, my having drunk five whiskeys is in the circumstances a sufficient cause of my tipsiness, and so is my having drunk so-and-so fluid ounces of alcohol; but these causes, though no doubt intimately related, are not identical (whisky isn't pure alcohol). So, I would argue, an event can perfectly well have non-identical simultaneous sufficient causes (without real causal overdetermination), so long as the distinct causes are intimately related in the right sort of way; and I would argue that realization, in the sense I intend, suffices for the right sort of way (see Melnyk 2003, Ch. 4).

Second question: even if Kim is right that the causal efficacy of mental properties requires reduction in the sense of the identity of mental property-instances with physical property-instances, how is it supposed to follow that it requires functional reduction, i.e. reduction that (pp. 101-102) requires mental properties to have causal-role definitions? Why couldn't we have reduction in the first sense but not in the second (in the spirit, perhaps, of Davidson's anomalous monism)? Kim makes a comment pertinent to this question in a footnote, saying that "the relevant sense in which an instance of M = an instance of P requires either property identity M = P or some form of reductive relationship between them" (p. 42); but this sheds little light. Kim's well known account of identity conditions for events no doubt provides part of a fuller answer, but it also generates a paradox. It provides part of a fuller answer because the account entails that this instance of M = this instance of P only if M = P. It generates a paradox because, for the very same reason, it seems to entail that this instance of M ยน this instance of P if M is a functional property defined over physical properties and hence distinct from any physical property, including P. One wishes Kim had said more.

Third question: how does Kim think that granting identities between mental property-instances and physical property-instances restores the otherwise threatened causal efficacy of the mental, especially given his enthusiasm for functional reduction and opposition to the type-identification of mental with physical properties? One would have thought that identifying mental property-instances with physical property-instances, while denying that mental properties are identical with physical properties, would yield a position that, like anomalous monism, failed to account for the causal relevance of mental properties. Of course, Kim's view certainly differs from anomalous monism, since, unlike anomalous monism, it requires the functional reducibility of mental properties. But how exactly does adding functional reducibility make mental properties causally relevant? We are not told. The closest Kim comes to answering this crucial question is to tell us that, on his view, pain as a mental kind is not, as we might have feared, epiphenomenal, just "causally heterogeneous" (p. 26); but I don't understand this remark well enough to evaluate it.

Let us return now to exposition of the argument consisting of claims (1) through (4), and in particular to premise (2). Admittedly, Kim doesn't always sound as if he endorses (2); for example, in his canonical account of functional reduction (pp. 101-102), he merely says that a property to be reduced must be "given a functional definition" (p. 101; italics removed), which, since there can be real definitions of properties, seems to leave open the possibility that a property could be functionalized to Kim's satisfaction if it were shown, a posteriori, to be identical with a functional (i.e., higher-order, causal role) property. However, subsequent discussions, especially in Ch. 6, make it clear that Kim indeed endorses (2). First, he treats the provision of a functional definition for a property as a conceptual matter (e.g., pp. 3, 108, and 163), which, like most philosophers (though not me), he presumably takes to imply that functional definition must therefore be an a priori matter. Secondly, as Kim must be aware, the considerations he marshals in Ch. 6 to support premise (3) -- e.g., the conceivability of pain without its accustomed causal role, or vice versa -- are in principle capable only of showing that no a priori accessible conceptual connection holds between our concept of pain and our concept of any functional state; they cannot show -- at least without very controversial elaboration that Kim doesn't provide -- that pain itself could not turn out, a posteriori, to be identical with a functional state. So the needs of Kim's overall argument force him to endorse (2).

So what is Kim's case for premise (2)? In particular, what grounds are there for holding that the functional reducibility of a property requires the property to have a functional definition that is accessible a priori? The question is crucial for Kim's overall project. For the obvious way to block his case against physicalism is to accept the functional reducibility of seemingly non-physical properties, but to insist that the functional definitions that such properties must therefore have reflect empirical discovery of the identity of these properties with functional properties, and so can be neither supported nor refuted by a priori analysis. The answer to the question, however, is not immediately clear. Kim certainly does argue that his a priori functional reductionism handles Levine's problem of the explanatory gap better than a reductive identification a posteriori of phenomenal properties with neurophysiological properties: his a priori functional reductionism, he says, genuinely explains why brain state B is correlated with phenomenal state P, whereas the reductive identification of P with a neurophysiological property merely declares the explanatory question illegitimate, by revealing it as resting on the false presupposition that B and P are distinct kinds of state (pp. 113-119). But because this advantage for a priori functional reductionism doesn't derive from its requirement that functional definitions be accessible a priori, the advantage (whatever its worth) could equally be claimed for the a posteriori form of functional reductionism that I recommend. So we need to look elsewhere for a reason to prefer a priori over a posteriori functional reductionism.

The place to look, I suggest, is Ch. 5 of Kim's book. Now its official purpose is to object to the idea (defended by Hill, McLaughlin, Block, and Stalnaker, amongst others) that the identification of phenomenal with neurophysiological properties can be supported empirically by inference to the best explanation; but there is nothing in the logic of Kim's objection, as we shall see, that makes it any less powerful against the idea that the identification of phenomenal with functional properties can be supported in the same way. However, Kim's line of objection suggests a reason for preferring a priori over a posteriori functional reductionism. For suppose Kim is right that inference to the best explanation can't support claims of mental-physical or mental/functional identity; and suppose further that no other form of non-deductive reasoning can support such claims; then, because such claims can't be supported a posteriori at all, a posteriori reductionism of any kind, functional or neurophysiological, is impossible, and a priori functional reductionism is the only game in town. (Likewise for a posteriori and a priori versions of physicalism.) I should stress that in mooting this fascinating argument for a priori functional reductionism I am going somewhat beyond Kim's words; but the trajectory of his words is toward it (see especially pp. 147-8).

Does Kim prove that the identification of phenomenal with neurophysiological (or functional) properties can't be supported empirically by inference to the best explanation? The key claim in his argument is that whenever identity claims appear to play a genuine explanatory role, they in fact "serve only as rewrite rules, and … are not implicated in the explanatory activity" (p. 145; italics original). So, "the best they can do is to 'transfer' explanations that have already been completed -- not from one phenomenon to another phenomenon, but from one description of a phenomenon to another description of the same phenomenon" (p. 146; italics original). I think what Kim means is that when a true identity claim is added to other explanatory premises, it doesn't describe any new explanatory factor in the world; it leaves the reality which underlies, and must underlie, any correct explanation untouched. Therefore, because identities don't in themselves contribute to the explanatory power of an explanation, they can't be supported via inference to the best explanation.

What response, if any, can a posteriori functional (or physical) reductionists make to this reasoning? I can envisage a conservative response and a radical response. The conservative response aims to undermine Kim's reasoning. There is more than one way (it might be said) in which a claim in an explanation can help to make the explanation the best explanation of some agreed phenomenon. One way, of course, is by contributing its own explanatory power, stricto sensu; but no identity claim (let us concede to Kim) can help in this way. But another way is by contributing to the parsimony of the explanation, since parsimony is also a good-making feature of an explanation. But here an identity claim can help, by its (metaphysical) implication that there is only one kind (of thing or stuff) in the world where rival explanations posit two kinds (H2O, rather than H2O and water; brain-state B247, rather than B247 and pain). If this is correct, then the status of an explanation as best can still provide evidence that any identity claims it requires are true, even though, as Kim rightly insists, identity claims introduce no new explanatory factors.

The radical response aims to evade Kim's reasoning, by shifting to a modified position. Philosophers who hold that inference to the best explanation can be used to provide evidence for psychofunctional (or psychophysical) identity claims are guided by (1) the general idea that such claims can be evidenced by the same kind of reasoning -- whatever that is -- by which scientific hypotheses in general are evidenced, and (2) the specific idea that scientific hypotheses in general are evidenced by inference to the best explanation. However, there is at least one account of how scientific hypotheses in general are evidenced which contradicts this specific idea (see Kitcher 1993, Ch. 7). On this account, a hypothesis is evidenced to the extent that it is more successful than its rivals at (i) staying consistent with the data and (ii) minimizing the number of entities and laws that it must treat as explanatorily basic. Let psychofunctional (or psychophysical) identity theorists adopt this Kitcherian account instead of inference to the best explanation. They can then claim that their favored identity hypotheses are better evidenced than emergentist rivals because, although both kinds of hypothesis can be made consistent with the empirical data (e.g., observed correlations between brain-states and pains), the emergentist hypotheses must treat more entities and laws as explanatorily basic than must the identity hypotheses. But whether identity claims themselves are explanatory is beside the point; Kim's objection is thus evaded.


Kitcher, Philip. 1993. The Advancement of Science. New York: Oxford University Press.

Melnyk, Andrew. 2003. A Physicalist Manifesto: Thoroughly Modern Materialism. New York: Cambridge University Press.