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Daniel Stoljar, Physicalism, Routledge, 2010, 252pp., $39.95 (pbk), ISBN 9780415452632.

Reviewed by Barbara Montero, The Graduate Center, City University of New York, and College of Staten Island


It is somewhat incongruous that Daniel Stoljar's book Physicalism is part of Routledge's New Problems of Philosophy series, for physicalism, as Stoljar's quote from Fredrich Lange's book on the topic makes clear, "is as old as philosophy, but not older."[1] Lange, no doubt, is correct that strands of the view, or cluster of views, we refer to today as "physicalism" are found in Democritus, Epicurus and even Thales; nonetheless, under Stoljar's deft hand, the subject becomes new due to his focus on the distinctly contemporary concern of how to define or interpret physicalism. His interest in this issue, as he mentions in the acknowledgements, was sparked by Noam Chomsky, who, Stoljar says, "first asked me what on earth I thought physicalism was anyway" (xii). The book, as well as a good part of the rest of Stoljar's insightful and abundant research, is a response to Chomsky's query.

The answer he arrives at is that physicalism is not the momentous doctrine that many have taken it to be; rather, on his view, any version of physicalism worthy of being called "physicalism" is false for reasons that come from within physics itself and have nothing to do with the grand problems of mind, meaning, and morality. "Physicalism," as he puts it, "has no formulations on which it is both true and deserving of the name" (165).

This answer, it must be admitted, is somewhat of a downer for those coming to the book in hopes of finding out why physicalism is considered, as Carl Gillett and Barry Loewer have put it, the Weltanschauung of our era.[2] To be sure, Stoljar softens this blow by presenting it as a 'bad news/good news" result, the good news being that although the question of physicalism is of no philosophical import, the host of philosophical problems that compose the physicalist's Weltanschauung can proceed unscathed; as he explains, "the fact that physicalism has no reasonable formulation does not entail that philosophical problems stated in terms of it have no reasonable formulation" (9). But just how good is this news? If physicalism has no reasonable interpretation, wouldn't it be better to hear that the wake of this realization washes away all those irritating problems as well? Alternatively, if the problems stand, can't one interpret physicalism in such a way that the debates over physicalism are really about physicalism? For Stoljar, such suggestions, which he refers to respectively as that of the "skeptics" and that of the "true believers," are dead ends.

Though the lion's share of the book, and what I shall primarily focus on, is devoted to the problem of interpreting physicalism -- seven of its eleven chapters are specifically about how to understand the thesis of physicalism, with one of the remaining devoted to laying out and countering the responses of the skeptics and the true believers -- it is worth pointing out that Stoljar also provides a brief and engaging history of the term "physicalism" and a clear presentation of some of the central arguments for and against physicalism. The book is well organized, with summaries at the end of each chapter and frequent recapitulations of the central argument. It also contains a healthy dose of wit. But let me return to Chomsky's question: what on earth is physicalism anyway?

Stoljar's answer is that physicalism, or what he also calls "the Starting Point View," is the thesis that "every instantiated property is either physical or is necessitated by some physical property," where the notion of a physical property is understood as a cluster concept, including all and only the following elements: it is a) a distinctive property of intuitively physical objects, b) expressed by a predicate of physics, c) objective, d) knowable through scientific investigation, and e) not a distinctive property of souls, ectoplasm, etc. The Starting Point View, he thinks, is rightly called "physicalism."

How happy would Chomsky be with this answer? One thing I imagine him asking is, "just what on earth is an intuitively physical object?" And I wonder about this as well. Stoljar tells us that an intuitively physical object is one that, unlike the number two, "we might in principle bump into or see or manipulate with our hands." But what does this mean? When I scoot my chair under the table, am I not also moving or manipulating quarks and leptons? Do I not see electrons through an electron microscope? Stoljar presumably thinks that the answer to these questions is "no," or at least that we do not manipulate or see these things in the relevant respects since his examples of intuitively physical objects are rocks and washing machines, and specifically not entities at the level of modern physics. Do these examples highlight our intuitive notion of the physical? Do we even have such intuitions? And if we do, where do they come from and are they relevant to how we should formulate the philosophical thesis of physicalism?

According to Chomsky, we tend to apply the honorific "physical" to objects just as soon as we are convinced that the objects exist: the physical world, he tells us, "is whatever we discover it to be, with whatever properties it must be assumed to have for the purposes of explanatory theory" (Chomsky 1988, 144). Ghosts and goblins we say are nonphysical because we just don't believe in them. The intuitions Stoljar is trying to mine, then, must not be Chomsky's. Are they the intuitions exemplified in ordinary language? It seems to me that in ordinary language we don't talk about washing machines being physical or otherwise. However, we do say such things as, "email me your paper and also send a physical copy." And, in Stoljar's favor, this physical copy is something that we can bump into and manipulate with our hands. However, if we are taking ordinary language as a guide, we also use the term "physical" to mean bodily, as opposed to intellectual, as when we say that, growing up, Jane was very physical, always riding her bike, running, getting into fights, and so forth, whereas her sister, Joan, was more cerebral and spent all her time reading. Yet it would seem that Stojar would want to say Joan is no more of a threat to physicalism than Jane and, moreover, that electronic copies of papers do not discredit the view. Thus it seems that ordinary language is not his home base.

At one point Stoljar suggests that the intuitive concept of a physical object can be uncovered by psychological experiments on babies, such as those performed by Elizabeth Spelke, which, he says, have made it "plausible to suppose that gravity as it is understood in Newtonian physics is not an intuitively physical property" (62). It is, however, slightly misleading to suggest that Spelke's experiments on babies uncover our intuitive notion of a physical object, since, although we may have an innate concept of what it is to be an object, we do not have an innate concept of what it is to be a specifically physical object. Nonetheless, what we innately believe about objects applies to physical objects too, so if we innately understand objects in terms of contact mechanics, then that is how we innately understand physical objects.

But why think that our innate beliefs are relevant to how we ought to understand the concept of physical for the purpose of discussing physicalism? Isn't relying on our innate concepts to guide our theories about what counts as physical something like relying on innate concepts to guide our philosophical theorizing about moral theory? Yet this is something we should not do. Perhaps, for example, our innate concept of public nudity (assuming we were to have one) is not connected to an attitude of disapprobation; certainly, babies feel no shame when faced with it. Yet this is not pertinent to how we ought to think, philosophically, about the morality of this issue. Similarly, our innate concept of an object would seem to be irrelevant to how we should think about physical objects for the purpose of philosophical debates over physicalism. Chomsky puts it more strongly: "whatever may be learned about folk science will have no relevance to the pursuit of naturalistic inquiry into the topics that folk science addresses in its own way."[3]

Putting aside the "where," "what," and "whether" questions about intuitively physical objects, let us look at the role physical objects play in Stoljar's theorizing. For Stoljar, being a distinctive property of an intuitively physical object is the first element in his cluster concept of physical property. When we plug this element along with the others into the Starting Point View, we get a theory, he tells us, that deserves the name "physicalism." He points out, however, that since physics itself is replete with properties that are not distinctive of intuitively physical objects, this theory is false; it is false because "modern physics provides a set of properties that are not starting point physical properties, and not necessitated by starting point physical properties" (63). So it is our concept of an intuitively physical object that both giveth life to the Staring Point View and taketh life away. Is there some other version of physicalism that avoids being refuted by physics itself? Stoljar thinks not because he thinks that any other thesis in the ballpark that is true is not rightly called "physicalism," because either "it is true at possible worlds where no version of physicalism is true or is false at possible worlds where no version of physicalism should be false." Putting these two ideas together, we get the bad news: there is no theory of physicalism that both deserves the name and is not false for reasons that even physicalists themselves readily accept.

The argument, as he lays it out at numerous places in the book, is this:

(P1) In formulating physicalism, we must operate either with the Starting Point View or some liberalized version of the Starting Point View.

(P2) If we operate with the Starting Point View, it is possible to articulate a version of physicalism that deserves the name, but that version is false.

(P3) If we operate with a liberalized version of the Starting Point View, it is possible to articulate a version of physicalism that is true, but that version does not deserve the name, because either:

(a) It is true at possible worlds where no version of physicalism should be true; or

(b) It is false at possible worlds where no version of physicalism should be false.

(C) There is no version of physicalism that is both true and deserving of the name.

Because I think that our everyday, intuitive notion of a physical object -- if we even have such a notion -- is not pertinent to the philosophical debate, I think that the Starting Point View is not a useful formulation of physicalism. Nonetheless, if we are liberal enough in our liberalization of the Starting Point View, casting off what we don't like, adjusting what we do, P1 is unobjectionable. There is an odd tension, however, between P2 and P3 since the reasons Stoljar has for thinking that the liberalized versions of the Starting Point View are not rightly called "physicalism" seem to apply to Starting Point Physicalism as well. Stoljar thinks that any liberalization of Starting Point Physicalism does not deserve the name physicalism because such liberalizations will either be true at possible worlds where physicalism is intuitively false or false at possible worlds where physicalism intuitively is true. (Here, the relevant intuitions, he tells us, are not everyday ones, but those of philosophers (55-56).) Yet Starting Point Physicalism is itself false at possible worlds that Stoljar would, I assume, take as intuitively physical, such as ours, or, to hedge bets, at a world that duplicates nothing else but our fundamental physics and everything that necessarily follows from this. So why, by Stoljar's own lights, should we think that Starting Point Physicalism deserves the name "physicalism?" Moreover, when Stoljar liberalizes the notion of physicalism, he takes the other aspects of his cluster concept individually, plugging them into his template definition of physicalism. Some of these, he argues, result in views that are false where no version of physicalism, he thinks, should be false. But, then, as the Starting Point View includes these elements, shouldn't the same arguments, if they are successful, show that the Starting Point View is, again, false in situations where no version of physicalism should be false and thus, again, show that the Starting Point View is not deserving the name physicalism?

Chomsky's trouble with Stoljar's argument would, presumably, start much earlier by questioning Stoljar's insight into which situations would or would not discredit physicalism. And, certainly, if we don't know what on earth counts as physicalism, intuitions are not going to be much help here. My concern, however, is more in line with that of the true believer: if Stoljar thinks that there is an intuitive notion of physicalism that allows us to judge which possibilities count as physically acceptable and which do not, why can't this intuition be the basis of our definition of physicalism?

The view of physicalism that Stoljar's philosophical intuitions line up most closely with is sometimes referred to as the via negativa, since it defines the physical negatively as being neither fundamentally mental, nor spiritual, nor normative, and so forth. Moreover, he thinks the debates over physicalism are actually debates over whether the distinctive properties of experience are necessitated by nonmental properties, an idea which encompasses a key element of the via negativa approach. Stoljar, however, thinks that the via negativa approach to defining the physical and physicalism is hopeless. As he explains, the approach to defining what it is to be physical negatively is something like trying to define what it is to be a dog negatively: you might say that a dog is neither cat, nor hamster, nor donkey and so forth indefinitely, "but it is quite unclear what the point of it would be" (88). Perhaps it is unclear why one would want to define the concept of dog negatively, but the via negativaists see the notion of the physical more like the concept of "organic food" than "dog." What is it for food to be organic? We need not go on indefinitely but can provide a short list of certain pesticides and chemicals that it must not contain. Similarly, the proponent of the via negativa need not go on indefinitely, but need merely list a few forbidden elements, such as the fundamental mental, the fundamental normative, and the spiritual, where this list is generated by items whose existence -- to put it fast and loose -- smells of theology. And the point of such a definition of the physical is, of course, to provide us with a definition of the physical that makes sense in the debates over physicalism.

I also question Stoljar's template for Starting Point Physicalism, expressed as the view that "every instantiated property is either physical or is necessitated by some physical property" (39). He relies on this to discredit some liberalizations of Starting Point Physicalism, such as what he calls "actual physics physicalism." For example, he argues that actual physics physicalism would be false in a twin-world that contains different fundamental properties: twin-mass, twin-charge, and twin-spin. Actual physics physicalism is false in this twin-world because it defines the physical properties in terms of the actual physical properties of a world, and in this twin-world it is not true that every instantiated property is either an actual physical property of our world or necessitated by some actual physical property of our world.

If we rely on a more standard formulation of the physicalist template in terms of duplication, this problem does not arise.[4] If physicalism, as many hold, is true at a worldw if and only if any possible world that duplicates all the actual physical properties of w, and nothing else save for what follows by necessity from those properties, duplicates everything about w, then physicalism could be true in a twin world that contains different fundamental properties since any possible world that duplicates the fundamental properties of this twin world could duplicate all of this world's properties. This is similar to what Stoljar refers to as the "indexicality response" to his twin-world argument; however, it avoids the fancy footwork needed to make the response in the first place.

Stoljar, though, does not think that the indexical response solves the problem of defining physicalism. Rather, on his view it gives us a theory that would be true in what he refers to as the "classical dualist world," which is a world that is very much like our world except that reference to souls plays an ineliminable role in the full explanation of the behavior of bodies (80). He thinks that the revised physicalism would be true in this world because he understands the relevant physical properties as the properties referred to by physical theory, where physical theory is "a theory that a scientist produces in the course of the project of explaining the nature and behavior of ordinary physical objects and in the course of related projects" (74); as such, in the classical dualist world, physical theory would, among other things, refer to souls. Yet it seems to me that the typical way of dealing with this problem, which is to define physical theory so that it cannot make reference to souls and such like, is for the most part adequate.

Finally, I'd like to comment on Stoljar's criticism of Bas van Fraassen's view that physicalism is not a theory about what kinds of things exist, but rather an attitude of deference to science on this matter. Stoljar admits that many philosophers who call themselves physicalists have had this attitude towards science; yet, he argues, such an attitude is not sufficient for being in the physicalists' camp. He asks us to consider a counterpart of the physicalist Jack Smart who lives in the classical dualist world. This counterpart, Stoljar tells us, could have the relevant attitude of deference to science on matters of existence, yet "dualist-Smart," as he calls him, is no physicalist. "So the stance that van Fraassen identifies," he concludes, "is not sufficient for being a physicalist" (180). But if being a physicalist amounts to nothing more than having the stance van Fraassen identifies, then "dualist-Smart" is a physicalist.

What, then, is my overall evaluation of the book? I suppose it is clear that I think that the book wouldn't fully satisfy Chomsky. And I suppose it is also clear that I am not persuaded by Stoljar’s central argument for the conclusion that there is no version of physicalism that is plausibly true and worthy of the name. Nonetheless, the book makes a worthwhile contribution to the physicalist literature, both for students and researchers, since even though it doesn't answer Chomsky's question, it does a great job of showing us just how important and difficult this question is.

[1] Lange, F. (1875/1925) The History of Materialism and Criticism of its Present Importance, trans. E.C. Thomas, London: Routledge & Kegan Paul, p. 3.

[2] Gillett, C. and Loewer, B. (eds.) (2001), Physicalism and Its Discontents, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, p. ix).

[3] Chomsky, N. (1995), "Language and Nature," Mind 104 (413):1-61.

[4] There is a further question of whether necessitation is necessary at all. (See Montero, B. "Must Physicalism Imply the Supervenience of the Mental on the Physical?"Journal of Philosophy, forthcoming.) Stoljar has a chapter devoted to this question, arguing that unless physicalism entails that physical properties necessitate all properties, "we are not going to be able to discern a difference between physicalism and standard forms of dualism" (129). Yet he only makes one attempt to formulate physicalism without this necessity condition. Perhaps this attempt is compatible with dualism, yet to show that the necessity condition is necessary for physicalism, he needs to show that no other version of physicalism without that condition can distinguish physicalism from dualism.