Physics and Metaphysics in Descartes and in His Reception

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Delphine Antoine-Mahut and Sophie Roux (eds.), Physics and Metaphysics in Descartes and in His Reception, Routledge, 2019, 219pp., $140.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781138351448.

Reviewed by Andrew Platt, Stony Brook University


This collection of papers, edited by Delphine Antoine-Mahut and Sophie Roux, is from two international conferences held in 2013 at the École Normale Supérieure of Paris and at the École Normale Supérieure of Lyon. Although the majority of the contributions are by French or Italian scholars, the papers are all in English. So this book may serve as a resource for Anglophone readers who could benefit from the work of these European scholars.

The collection's organizing themes are Descartes's conception of metaphysics, his understanding of the relationship between physics and metaphysics, and the historical reception of Descartes's views about these matters. The topics of the chapters are thus fairly narrow in scope. However, the best essays make contributions to the secondary literature that will be of interest to specialists in the history of philosophy or intellectual history.

The book has three parts. Part I consists of three chapters that give a chronological overview of historiography about Descartes's metaphysics and physics. The first chapter, by Mariafranca Spallanzani, discusses Descartes's reception in the eighteenth century. It highlights D'Alembert, and to a lesser extent Voltaire and Condillac. Spallanzani notes that these Enlightenment philosophes separate Descartes's contribution to physics (which they praise) from his metaphysics (of which they are critical).

The second chapter, by Delphine Antoine-Mahut, focuses on nineteenth century French historiography. Antoine-Mahut starts with Victor Cousin's views about the relationship between philosophy, metaphysics, physics and psychology. She then discusses four papers (by Jean-André Rouchoux, Charles Renouvier, Francisque Bouillier, and Jean-Baptiste Bordas-Demoulin) that were submitted in 1839 to an essay contest about the history of Cartesianism. The chapter emphasizes the revival of interest in Descartes's metaphysics in this period among French "spiritualists."

The third chapter, by Delphine Bellis, discusses Descartes and twentieth century philosophy of science. Bellis ostensibly focuses on the first half of the twentieth century. However, many of the works discussed are from the late nineteenth century -- and barely any of the works post-date the 1920s. Among mid-twentieth century philosophers of science, Bellis discusses only Gaston Bachelard (1884-1962). Bellis' primary focus is on the way that Auguste Comte's positivism influenced early twentieth century readings of Descartes, particularly in the work of Louis Liard (1846-1917), Gaston Milhaud (1858-1918, Émile Meyerson (1859-1933), and Pierre Duhem (1861-1916). Bellis argues that, following Comte, these authors tend to downplay the putative connection between Descartes's physics and his metaphysics. Instead, Bellis notes that early twentieth century interpreters -- including Liard and Ernst Cassirer -- took Descartes's physics to derive somehow from his views about method or epistemology.

I confess that I was not previously familiar with a number of the French authors considered in chapters 2 and 3. Many of the thinkers covered in Part I are rarely discussed by English-speaking historians of philosophy. So this part of the book may be of use to someone looking to orient himself or herself with respect to nineteenth century French historiography or philosophy of science.

Part II is comprised of four chapters about metaphysics and physics in Descartes. These chapters consider interpretive problems raised by Descartes's own works -- with one exception. The exception is chapter 4, by Christoph Lüthy. This chapter discusses a possible line of influence on Descartes's thought that had not previously been studied.

Lüthy argues that Descartes's position (contra the Aristotelians) that metaphysics is the foundation of physics is anticipated in the works of Nicolaus Taurellus (1547-1606) and David Gorlaeus (1591-1612). Lüthy shows that Gisbertus Voetius' criticism of the Cartesian Henricus Regius explicitly link the views of Regius and Descartes with those of Gorlaeus and Taurellus; Lüthy also explains how Taurellus' views came to be widely discussed in the Netherlands of the early sixteenth century due to a controversy surrounding the theologian Conrad Vorstius. I found Lüthy's paper to be an especially interesting and informative study of sixteenth and seventeenth century intellectual history. It is (in my opinion) one of the highlights of this volume.

In chapter 5, Emanuela Scribano discusses an apparent tension between Descartes's distinction between three grades of sensation in the Sixth Replies and his physiological account of sense-perception in the earlier Treatise on Man. Contra some recent interpretations that try to reconcile the positions in these works, she suggests that the physical theory in Descartes's earlier works is inconsistent with his mature metaphysics. Scribano sketches an account of the development of Descartes's metaphysical views starting in the late 1620s, and culminating in the first philosophy of the Meditations. She argues that Descartes's remarks in the Sixth Replies about his earlier scientific works -- in particular his remarks about the Optics -- misrepresent his earlier views about the respective roles of reason and the senses in distance-perception. Similarly, Scribano argues that Descartes's views about sensation in non-human animals shift over time. She concludes that Descartes's remarks in the Fifth Replies about whether or not a dog makes a judgment when it recognizes its master are "a strategic ploy to sidestep the problems caused by the development of [his] metaphysics" (121). It is unclear to me, however, that the textual evidence that Scribano cites supports her more sweeping claims about the incompatibility of Descartes's physics with his metaphysics. Descartes may have been less than forthcoming in the Fifth Replies when pressed by Gassendi or may misrepresent his views in the Optics when he summarizes the earlier text in the Sixth Replies. But this does not show that the rationalist first philosophy of the Meditations is fundamentally incompatible with Descartes's mechanistic physics.

Scribano's chapter highlights the role of experience in human knowledge in Descartes's earlier scientific works. On her reading, these texts suppose at least a limited kind of empiricism. In chapter 6, the late Desmond M. Clarke argues that Descartes endorses a radical form of empiricism starting as early as his Rules for the Direction of the Mind. Clarke compares the view he finds in Descartes to Quine's naturalized epistemology, according to which (says Clarke) "no sources of knowledge are ultimately independent of experience" and "even the human act of acquiring knowledge is merely a . . . complex natural phenomenon" (126). Clarke argues for the provocative thesis that Descartes maintains this empiricist position throughout his philosophical career.

In chapter 7, Sophie Roux addresses an entrenched debate in the literature about the metaphysical foundations of Descartes's physics. Daniel Garber and Gary Hatfield argue that Descartes is committed to the view that God is the sole cause of all natural motions. On this widely discussed reading, Descartes is an occasionalist about natural motion, and denies that mere bodies have any intrinsic power or motive force. Roux briefly canvasses other positions in the debate about occasionalism and force in Descartes's physics, including the interpretations of Tad Schmaltz and Helen Hattab. Roux tries to offer a new alternative to these readings, which she describes as a "deflationist interpretation." She argues that Descartes distinguishes between two types of causation. The first type is a total efficient cause that creates and conserves its effect. According to Roux, the second type of cause is nameless and is indescribable (151). It can be characterized only negatively, insofar as "it is not universal, it does not conserve, it is not efficient" (153). Following Kenneth Clatterbaugh, Roux takes Descartes to think that God is the only total and efficient cause. But she maintains that bodies are causes in this mysterious second sense. More work is needed to show that this interpretation is interestingly different from those extant in the literature (e.g., by Clatterbaugh and Steven Nadler), and that it is preferable to "concurrentist" interpretations that draw on medieval sources to better understand Descartes's distinction between the "primary" cause of motion and "secondary causes."

The anthology's editors present Part III as a survey of responses to Descartes, organized by geographic region (the Dutch Republic, Italy, England, Germany). The first two essays in Part III fit this template.

Chapter 8 is an informative and well-researched study by Antonella Del Prete. It focuses on the Cartesian thinker Johannes De Raey, and the way he understood the relationship between academic disciplines. Del Prete discusses De Raey's correspondence with Christoph Wittich, and puts De Raey's views in the context of the controversies surrounding the teaching of Cartesian philosophy in Dutch universities. De Prete also tracks changes in De Raey's views about first philosophy and its relation to theology.

Chapter 9, by Pierre Girard, is about Descartes's reception in seventeenth century Naples. It discusses Neapolitan scientific academies, such as the Academia degli Investiganti, that reacted positively to what Girard calls Descartes's "methodological materialism." It also discusses the views of Pietro Giannone (1676-1748), who, according to Girard, developed a "materialist interpretation of Descartes" (183).

The remaining essays in Part III are not so much about reactions or responses to Descartes's views, as they are about the views of other seventeenth century figures about metaphysics and physics. In chapter 10, Philippe Hamou shows how Francis Bacon's conception of metaphysics influenced Boyle and Newton. Hamou contrasts their views about the relationship between metaphysics and physics with that of Descartes. The thrust of his paper is that Boyle and Newton's respective views developed more in response to Bacon than to Descartes. Nevertheless, the views discussed in this chapter serve as an interesting counterpoint to the view of Descartes and the Cartesians discussed elsewhere in the book.

The last two chapters are devoted to Leibniz. Chapter 11, by Jean-Pascal Anfray, is about Leibniz's response to an argument by Bayle. According to Anfray, Bayle uses the "doctrine of conservation as continual creation" (which Anfray labels CCC), together with the thesis of temporal atomism, to argue for occasionalism. The main part of Anfray's essay tries to unpack Leibniz's views about continual creation, temporal atomism, and related issues. This topic is related (somewhat tangentially) to the volume's main themes, insofar as the disagreement between Bayle and Leibniz centers on metaphysical theses drawn from Descartes. And Anfray's reading of Leibniz is (I think) more or less correct. But Anfray's analysis is unclear about some key points.

Anfray distinguishes between a "strong reading" and a "weak reading" of CCC. But when he refers to CCC later, he does not always clarify which interpretation of the doctrine is at issue. He is also unclear about the logical relationship between CCC and temporal atomism. He writes that on the strong reading CCC "appears [to be] a natural consequence of temporal atomism" (216), and suggests that Descartes takes temporal atomism to imply CCC (217). Anfray also says that Leibniz "takes for granted that strong CCC presupposes temporal atomism" (231). This would mean (I take it) that strong CCC entails temporal atomism. But Anfray seems to hold that strong CCC and temporal atomism "are distinct in principle" (218),  that is to say, logically independent of one another. I was left unsure of what Anfray took the actual logical relationship between these theses to be, and whether or not his interpretive conclusions relied on claiming that the historical figures being discussed were mistaken or confused about this issue.

The final chapter is by Mogens Lærke. It deals with Leibniz's views about intellectual ethics, in particular Leibniz's views about the value of what he calls the "spirit of moderation." Lærke argues that Leibniz's intellectual ethics influenced which metaphysical and physical theories he took to be true. According to Lærke, these considerations played an important role in motivating Leibniz's system of pre-established harmony. Given the stated themes of the book, its notable that Lærke never mentions Descartes (although it does mention "Cartesian mechanism" twice, in passing).

It is not unusual for a collection of conference papers to include essays that do not quite fit the books' primary themes. Yet I was disappointed that the third part of Antoine-Mahut and Roux's anthology did not include contributions about Descartes's reception among other, lesser-known authors in England or Germany (or in Italy outside of Naples). The strength of this volume lies in its attention to intellectual history of the sort that is not often discussed in Anglophone historiography, but that is given more emphasis in the work of European scholars. The collection would have been well-served, then, by the inclusion of more scholarship that focuses on the history of Cartesianism.