Physics, Mathematics and Skepticism

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Hilary Putnam, Philosophy in an Age of Science: Physics, Mathematics and Skepticism, Mario de Caro and David Macarthur (eds.), Harvard University Press, 2012, 672pp., $59.95 (hbk), ISBN 9780674050136.

Reviewed by Stathis Psillos, University of Athens


In his address to the Fourth International Congress of Philosophy held at Bologna in 1911, Henri Bergson noted that "a philosopher worthy of the name has never said more than a single thing: and even then it is something he has tried to say, rather than actually said". This single thing, he added, being "a thought which brings something new into the world", "is of course obliged to manifest itself through the ready-made ideas it comes across and draws into its movement".

What then is Hilary Putnam's -- who has been one of the major philosophers of the twentieth century -- 'single thought' and what is the 'something new' it brings into the world? Well, it's not quite a single thought but it can be captured, I think, by the following: there is something about science which is of incomparable cognitive significance and there is something about human beings which is of incomparable moral significance. The 'something new' then that Putnam's outstanding philosophical endeavour brings to the world is the fusion of the scientific image of the world with a moral image of human beings. This is the thread that runs through the papers that compose Putnam's latest collection: Philosophy in an Age of Science: Physics, Mathematics and Skepticism. As Putnam puts it: "My efforts in philosophy have always been intended to provide intellectual and moral support to those who have realistic sensibilities in science and 'cognitivist' sensibilities in ethics" (93). In this review, I will concentrate my attention to the first two parts of the book, which discuss issues in the philosophy of science and mathematics.

Putnam makes a concerted effort to dispel a popular misconception that when he criticized metaphysical realism he had also abandoned scientific realism too (see especially p. 92). Actually, those who had tried to follow his work on scientific realism closely would know that he never put scientific realism on halt. In the midst of his conversion to internal or pragmatic realism, as Putnam tended to call his verificationist turn, he published a significant (but perhaps not widely read) piece in which he did endorse scientific realism, suitably dissociated from both materialism and metaphysical realism (cf. 1982). Back in the early 1980s, scientific realism was still what it was taken to be by the Putnam of 1960s and 1970s -- the ferocious critic of instrumentalism, operationalism, fictionalism and other forms of scientific anti-realism. Scientific realism was still taken to involve commitment to the following theses: theoretical entities have irreducible existence (they exist in the very same sense in which ordinary middle-sized objects exist and are irreducible to either them or complexes of sensations); theoretical terms featuring in distinct theories can and do refer to the same entities (hence, there is referential continuity in theory-change); there is convergence in the scientific image of the world; and scientific statements can be (and are) true. Yet, the verificationist Putnam of the early 1980s took truth to be "correct assertibility in the language we use" (1982, 197). So scientific realism was retained but dressed up in a verificationist garment.

The Putnam of the 1960s took it that verificationism superseded fictionalism as the dominant anti-realist position in the philosophy of science because it offered an easy and straightforward way out of the sceptical challenge. A sceptical scenario in which we are all brains-in-a-vat and yet all our experiences are as if we are ordinary human beings is a pseudo-hypothesis, according to verificationism. Being an arch critic of verificationism, the early Putnam claimed that verificationism -- and its concomitant anti-scepticism -- was the wrong reason to reject fictionalism. He (1971, 352) called a verificationism-based rejection of scepticism "the worst argument of all".

Subsequently, Putnam mounted a wholesale attack on what he called metaphysical realism. To cut a long story short, Metaphysical Realism (MR) is the view that honours what I call 'THE POSSIBILITY OF DIVERGENCE', viz., the thought that when truth is attributed to a theory, this is a substantive attribution which is meant to imply that the theory is made true by the world, which, in its turn, is taken to imply that it is logically possible that an accepted and well-confirmed theory might be false simply because the world might not conform to it. This claim is meant to capture a sense in which the world is independent of theories, beliefs, warrants, epistemic norms and practices. Putnam's chief point against MR was meant to show that honouring this possibility is incoherent. This is the role of the famous model-theoretic argument against MR. The verificationist turn was meant to fill in the vacuum left by the supposed collapse of MR.

The culprit was supposed to be the concept of truth involved in the characterisation of metaphysical realism -- viz., a non-epistemic account of truth. Michael Dummett and his followers had developed broadly epistemic accounts of truth, based on the idea that truth is a form of warranted assertibility. Crispin Wright (1992) pointed out that only a strong epistemic conception of truth rules out the possibility that a warrantedly assertible statement will not be controverted by subsequent information and hence it enshrines the stability of truth.  Wright introduced the idea of superassertibility as a candidate for an epistemic notion of truth. Superassertibility is "assertibility which would be endurable under any possible improvement to one's state of information" (1992, 75). Putnam (2001, 599) claimed that this was exactly the notion of truth that he had in mind in his verificationist period.

A key point of the early chapters of Philosophy in an Age of Science is that verificationism itself is incoherent -- a possibility that "neither [Putnam's] critics nor [himself] questioned" (78). If, Putnam says, correctness is identified with 'being verified' -- as verificationism implies -- then my correct attribution of mental states to others hinges on these attributions being verified by me in my own experience. These attributions, Putnam stresses, are "only intelligible to me as a device for making statements that are or will be verified by my experiences" (79). But this, he added, is solipsism! Putnam explains that his earlier time-slice tried to neutralise this solipsistic consequence by tying verification to 'ideal epistemic conditions'. But now he concedes that the very idea of ideal epistemic conditions must either be understood outside the framework of verificationism or else verificationism collapses into solipsism. Ergo: verificationism possesses "no public intelligibility" (80).

Is then MR a live option once more? "Yes and no", Putnam says (101). It is a position that he currently subscribes to insofar as he rejects verificationism. He fully accepts the view which his former self had tried to repudiate, viz., that there are truths that may well exceed the possibility of verification, or (equivalently) there are truths which do not depend on whether or not humans or other sentient beings could or could not verify them. But Putnam takes it that MR is committed to the view that there is just one true description of the world. To this view he opposes his own conceptual relativity; more precisely, he takes it that there are (or can be) equivalent descriptions-representations of the world. Here Putnam is not as clear as one might have expected. A typical example he employs comes from mereology: are there objects as well as their mereological sums? His familiar point is that there is no fact of the matter about this -- it is a matter of convention (57-58). Of the equivalent descriptions he says that they are "intertranslatable" and yet the translations "do not preserve 'ontology'", though they preserve explanations of the phenomena (57).

It seems to me that Putnam flirts with a version of the Carnapian external/internal distinction, which he intends to apply to supposedly grand metaphysical questions such as: are space-time points individuals or constructs? are there sets? etc. He clearly admits that as soon as a certain way of viewing the world is adopted, important existential questions are factual (58). Now, this is a vexed issue and needs more attention than I can offer it here. Putnam is right in suggesting that some questions that are supposed to be factual (especially in what is taken to be metaphysics) had better be seen as calling for conventions. But what are the limits of ontological liberty? A certain amount of ontological perspectivalism (which, ideally, should avoid gross inconsistencies among the alternative perspectives) should certainly be allowed by realism, but the ultimate arbiter, I think, should be the several sciences and their explanatory autonomy.

Putnam, in any case, puts his conceptual relativity to the service of metaphysical realism by stressing that the equivalent descriptions describe one and the same mind-independent reality. The very idea of equivalent descriptions is predicated on the existence of a mind-independent reality, which might be 'represented' in equivalent (that is, "mutually relatively interpretable") ways (64-65). The residual difficulty, it seems to me, is specifying the conditions under which two representations should be legitimately considered as genuinely equivalent descriptions of the same reality as opposed to descriptions which can be differentiated and assessed in terms of fitness and correctness by further and future evidence. In other words, the challenge is to say under what circumstances incompatibility at the level of surface grammar between theories (that is, incompatibilities among literally understood theories) are to be brushed off as hiding a 'deeper' representational and explanatory equivalence between them.

Where does all this leave scientific realism? Putnam is adamant that he still defends "the claim that scientific realism is the only philosophy of science that does not make the success of science a miracle" (55). He takes it to be the case that his early famous defence of scientific realism -- what came to be known as the no-miracles argument -- is a solid and sound argument against instrumentalist and fictionalist accounts of science. But, he insists, the no-miracles argument is not an argument for a realist (that is, non-epistemic) account of truth (of the truth attributed to the successful scientific theories). In his hitherto unpublished chapter 4, Putnam explains in detail how the issue of scientific realism (qua a view about scientific theories and their cognitive and theoretical claims) should be separated from the issue of the nature (or the correct conception) of truth, re-iterating and stressing his point that there are independent reasons to reject verificationism, which do not spring from accepting the no-miracles argument. It is indeed true that one can reject verificationism and still accept instrumentalism or fictionalism. Hence, arguing against the latter that (roughly put) realism is the best explanation of the success of science is still a valuable move. It is also true that it might be prima facie tempting to think that accepting the no-miracles argument need not imply that the truth attributed to scientific theories is verification transcendent. Here is how Putnam (1978, 19) described the problem in his John Locke lectures in 1976:

the realist's argument turns on the success of science, or, in an earlier day, the success of commonsense material-object theory. But what does the success of science have to do with the correspondence theory of truth? -- or any theory of truth, for that matter? That science succeeds in making many true predictions, devising better ways of controlling nature, etc., is an undoubted empirical fact. If realism is an explanation of this fact, realism must itself be an over-arching scientific hypothesis. And realists have often embraced this idea, and proclaimed that realism is an empirical hypothesis. Then it is left obscure what realism has to do with theory of truth.

The obscurity was lifted by him in a lecture he gave in Jerusalem right after the Locke lectures by claiming that admitting a correspondence account of truth best explains the success of action (and, in particular, the success of science). So, indeed, the move from the success of science to the truth of theories does not, on its own, dictate any conception of truth. And yet, when the further issue is raised, viz., which among the rival conceptions of truth best explains successful action, there is a winner -- or so Putnam at that time (I think correctly) thought. On this occasion at least, he treated theories as maps. The success of the map suggests that the map is on the right track. But then there is a further question: which conception of 'being on the right track' best explains why the map succeeds in guiding its users? Putnam's answer -- still timely and correct, I think -- is that "it corresponds in an appropriate way to a particular part of the earth" (1978, 100).

Even if we were to grant that a verificationist version of scientific realism was available (as the verificationist Putnam thought and as the current Putnam denies), there is good reason to think that a verificationist account of truth is at odds with the no-miracles argument. A moral that can be drawn from Putnam's early defence of scientific realism in the 1960s is that the success of science -- that realism is meant to explain -- is hard won. It is neither trivial, nor in any way guaranteed. The heated debate over the pessimistic induction (see my 1999, chapter 5) has driven the point home that if there is continuity in theory-change, this has been a considerable achievement, emerging from among a mixture of successes and failures of past scientific theories. A realist non-epistemic conception of truth and in particular THE POSSIBILITY OF DIVERGENCE that we noted above do justice to this hard-won fact of empirical success and convergence.

Given that there is no guarantee that science converges to the truth, or that whatever scientists come to accept in the ideal limit of inquiry or under suitably ideal epistemic conditions will (have to) be true, the claim that science does get to the truth (based mostly on explanatory considerations) is quite substantive and highly non-trivial. If, on the other hand, an epistemic conception of truth is adopted, or if THE POSSIBILITY OF DIVERGENCE is denied, the explanation of the success of science becomes almost trivial: success is guaranteed by a suitably chosen epistemic notion of truth, since -- ultimately -- science will reach a point in which it will make no sense to worry whether there is a possible gap between the way the world is described by scientific theories and the way the world is. Significantly, Putnam still defends the approximate truth of past successful theories, especially of Newtonian mechanics. To the claim that the very concept of 'approximate truth' is vague, he replies (I think entirely correctly): "To say that the concept 'approximate truth' must itself be made mathematically precise or else discarded is, I think, a form of scientism" (106).

One important fresh element of Putnam's current defence of scientific realism is his attempt to discuss the issue of realism in Quantum Mechanics. Here he utilises the no-miracles argument in order to show that instrumentalist interpretations of QM fail precisely on the grounds on which instrumentalist accounts of scientific theories in general fail. But isn't QM fraught with famous difficulties of interpretation? In chapters 6-8, Putnam assumes scientific realism and argues that there are three 'interpretations' of QM that are compatible with a realist (that is, anti-instrumentalist) account of QM. The key assumption that Putnam makes -- suggested already by John Bell and other physicists especially of the Bohmian tradition -- is that understanding a physical theory realistically requires being clear on what the 'ontology' of this theory is: what kinds of 'beables' this theory implies or assumes.

It is well-known that the interpretations of QM are divided into those that admit of a collapse of the wave-packet and those in which there is no collapse: the wave-packet 'evolves' according to the 'deterministic' Schrödinger equation. Among the collapse interpretations, there are those which take it that the collapse is spontaneous (internal to the system) and those which take it that the collapse is due to an external factor. Among the non-collapse interpretations, there are those which posit hidden variables and those that do not. Putnam -- after some thorough discussion -- takes it that there are three live options concerning the interpretation of QM: the GRW account (spontaneous collapse), the many worlds/minds interpretation (non-collapse), and the Bohm theory (non-collapse with hidden variables). He rejects the many minds/worlds story on the grounds that it fails to make sense of the role of probabilistic predictions in QM (if all possible histories -- splittings of the wave-packet -- are equally actual, it makes no sense to talk of probabilities of actual outcomes (144 & 155)). So his conclusion is that realists about QM have to choose between GRW and the Bohm theory, though perhaps some revision of physics will be required in either case. In a move that may be taken as a snub of the currently popular structural realism, Putnam notes that "mathematics does not transparently tell us what the theory is about" (161): an account of (preferably local) physical beables is required. At the same time, Putnam (434-436) distances himself from entity realism, by arguing that to say that one is a realist about an entity such as an electron without being a realist about quantum mechanics is to say nothing.

A close reading of Putnam's early defence of scientific realism shows that he thought his no-miracles argument goes as far as to secure some form of mathematical realism alongside scientific realism. Indeed, the most famous formulation of the no miracles argument ("The positive argument for realism is that it is the only philosophy that does not make the success of science a miracle.") occurs in a paper titled 'What is Mathematical Truth?' and is accompanied by the following claim (1975, 73):

I believe that the positive argument for realism has an analogue in the case of mathematical realism. Here too, I believe, realism is the only philosophy that doesn't make the success of science a miracle.

Putnam is famous for reviving an argument that was made popular by Quine, though it was first articulated by Frege (and as I recently found out, by Emile Borel too), viz., that the successful application of mathematics to the physical world, via the role it plays in the formulation of scientific theories, offers conclusive reasons to think that mathematics is true. This came to be known as 'the indispensability argument'. In essence, it is an explanatory argument akin to the no-miracles argument: accepting that classical mathematics is true best explains the success of the physical applications of mathematics (cf. Putnam 1975, 75). The following captured Putnam's view circa 1975:

science, including mathematics, is a unified story and that story is not myth but approximation to the truth (1975, xiii).

Putnam contrasted mathematical realism to fictionalism, the view that mathematical abstract entities are nothing more than useful fictions. This was taken to be the natural resting point of nominalism -- with its denial of abstract entities of any sort.

Putnam comes back to this issue with fresh and significant ideas in the present volume (especially chapter 9). He first distinguishes his own version of the indispensability argument from Quine's. He takes it that in Quine's version, the argument's conclusion concerns the existence of mathematicalia qua abstract entities whilst in Putnam's version, the argument's conclusion is that mathematics is true, where truth is not to be equated with provability or verifiability. As such, Putnam's version does not imply the existence of abstract entities but only the objectivity of mathematics. Putnam places his own indispensability argument in context by arguing that it is an argument suitable for scientific realists: if you are a scientific realist, then you should be a realist, but not necessarily a Platonist, about mathematics (especially those involved in science). Actually, he leaves it open whether or not a realist about mathematics should go for Platonism or for Putnam's famous 'mathematics-is-modal-logic' thesis. These two positions, he notes (182-183) can be taken to be 'equivalent descriptions'.

Putnam insists that scientific realism is inconsistent with a verificationist account of mathematical truth. His major fresh argument for this claim is the following. Assumed true, as scientific realism requires, scientific theories imply that the differential equations that describe the temporal evolution of a certain physical system have solutions for each and every real value of the time parameter t. Take a statement of the form S: 'the solutions to equation E of physical system P for time value t falls in the interval <r1, r2>' and assume that S is true. If truth were to be equated with provability (or any other verification-dependent notion), then it would follow that a physicist who asserted the truth of S would be committed to the further claim that it is possible (empirically possible) to calculate the solution to equation E and that this calculation would lead to values within <r1, r2>. But this further claim may well be unwarranted given present knowledge (189). Putnam makes heavy use of this argument throughout the book, but especially in his critique of Wittgenstein's verificationism (in chapters 25-26). He stresses that on a verificationist account of mathematical truth, physical theories end up being devices for prediction: where no predictions are issued, they say nothing at all (222). If one is a scientific realist, one should not be a verificationist anti-realist about mathematics.

This critique of verificationism permeates the whole book. Putnam's general point is important and sound. Verificationism is an unstable conception of truth: if truth is equated with the logical possibility of verification, then this differs little from a realist account of truth; if truth is equated with more substantive accounts of verification (e.g., empirical verification), then this makes truth considerably weak and unstable.

In his discussion of mathematical realism and anti-verificationism, Putnam shows in an exemplary way how up-to-date his views are. Not only does he criticise a Field-like type of fictionalism; he argues very effectively against recent weaker fictionalist views, which take it that a conception of 'nominalistic adequacy' of scientific theories is enough to capture the scientific realist commitments. An increasingly popular recent view is that even if scientific theories cannot be nominalised à la Field, and even if mathematics is, in some sense, theoretically indispensable, commitment to mathematical realism (and abstract objects in particular) can be avoided. What matters, it is argued, for the applicability of scientific theories and what is enough to explain their empirical successes is that they are nominalistically adequate, where a theory T is nominalistically adequate if [and only if] its nominalistically-stated consequences, that is those of its consequences that do not quantify over mathematical entities, are correct. Putnam focuses on Gideon Rosen's (2001) model-theoretic account of nominalistic adequacy, according to which a (mathematised) theory T "is nominalistically adequate iff the concrete core of the actual world is an exact intrinsic duplicate of the concrete core of some world at which T is true -- that is, just in case things are in all concrete respects as if T were true". Against this view Putnam (197-199) argues that (a) the distinction between the concrete and the abstract is not as watertight as it is normally presupposed, especially in light of modern physics; and (b) that the very notion of 'nominalistic adequacy' (like its weaker cousin 'empirical adequacy' or 'simplicity') cannot play the role of a truth-predicate and cannot explain why and how theories end up being successful. (For more on this issue see my 2010; for a more general account of Putnam's travails with scientific realism, see my 2012).

Chapters 16 and 17 include two technical proofs; the first shows that scientific theories can have non-trivial (though not quite ordinary) empirically equivalent rivals, while the second shows that the Craig-reduct of a theory T is not equivalent to the Ramsey-sentence of the theory; hence, the Ramsey-sentence has excess content over the (set of) observational consequences of a theory.

If verificationism is abandoned, how is scepticism to be avoided? In part four of the collection (chapters 29-32), Putnam summons epistemic contextualism to the rescue, by arguing that "doubt must be capable of justification as much as belief" (504) and that doubt "must satisfy context-sensitive standards of relevance" (499). If this line is followed, then the sceptical question 'Does X know that p?' is not unequivocal and always meaningful. Whether or not it makes sense to raise it depends on the context and in particular on what counts as a justified doubt in a certain context. Putnam (chapter 31) goes as far as to claim that the sceptical call for the justification of the rules of induction is not a coherent demand, and he concludes by insisting that his new anti-sceptical position does not depend in any way on a prior commitment to verificationism.

Part three of the collection is about ethics, values and the moral image of humans. Part four is about Wittgenstein -- especially his views of mathematics and his remarks on Gödel. Part six is about Putnam's recent philosophy of mind. Significantly, he outlines his recent transactionism, which takes it that perception depends on a transaction between the perceiver and the environment, distancing himself from both disjunctivism and representationalism.

Philosophy in an Age of Science is a huge collection, but the benefits of working through it will be huge too. Putnam grapples with deep and genuine philosophical problems, tries new ideas and arguments, looks back at his former endeavours and theses and re-orients and re-positions himself in a changing philosophical landscape with passion, ingenuity and flair. Those in particular who are interested in the implications of a realist stance in the philosophy of science and mathematics cannot afford to miss it.


Psillos, Stathis (1999) Scientific Realism: How Science Tracks Truth, London: Routledge.

Psillos, Stathis (2010) 'Scientific Realism: Between Platonism and Nominalism', Philosophy of Science 77: 947-958.

Psillos, Stathis (2012) 'One Cannot Be Just a Little Bit Realist: Putnam and van Fraassen'. In James Robert Brown (ed.) Philosophy of Science: The Key Thinkers, London: Continuum, pp.188-212.

Putnam, Hilary (1971) Philosophy of Logic, London: G Allen & Unwin Ltd.

Putnam, Hilary (1975) Mathematics, Matter and Method, Philosophical Papers Vol.1, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.

Putnam, Hilary (1978) Meaning and the Moral Sciences, Routledge and Kegan Paul.

Putnam, Hilary (1982) 'Three Kinds of Scientific Realism', The Philosophical Quarterly 32: 195-200.

Putnam, Hilary (2001) 'When 'Evidence-Transcendence' is not Malign: A Reply to Crispin Wright', The Journal of Philosophy 98: 594-600.

Rosen, Gideon (2001) 'Nominalism, Naturalism, Epistemic Relativism', Philosophical Perspectives 15: 69-91.

Wright, Crispin (1992) Truth and Objectivity, Cambridge MA: Harvard University Press.