Physics, Structure, and Reality

Physics Structure And Reality

Jill North, Physics, Structure, and Reality, Oxford University Press, 2021, 252pp., $85.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780192894106.

Reviewed by David Albert, Columbia University


This is a meticulous and deliberate and beautiful book.

People used to say of Ernest Nagel’s now-neglected classic The Structure of Science that its greatness was in its many qualifications—because those qualifications were meant not to mislead, or to conceal, or to dissemble, or to preempt potential criticisms—but precisely, and on the contrary, to be honest and forthright and un-sensational and clear. To acknowledge that philosophy is hard. To show how philosophy is responsibly done. And that’s very much how I feel reading Jill North’s book.

This is (to begin with) a book about scientific realism—in the most familiar and straightforward and old-fashioned and flat-footed sense of that term. And it is not so much about the thesis of that kind of realism as it is about the practice of that kind of realism. It is (more particularly) an exquisitely detailed and sober and penetrating discussion of an ocean of difficult and interesting questions that come up in connection with the practice of reading our best and most fundamental physical theories as accounts of what the world might actually be like.

North does not propose anything as cut and dried as a “method” for that kind of reading here—and her book would be much less interesting than it is, and much less valuable than it is, if she had. There is what you might call an approach—which is to attend, as carefully as one can, to what North calls “structure”, and to follow its lead (other things being equal) in drawing conclusions about what the world is really like. “I will be suggesting” she says “that there is a certain notion of structure that is familiar (if often inexplicit) in physics and mathematics, and that paying attention to structure in this sense, both in the mathematical formalism and in the physical world, is important to figuring out what physics, and especially fundamental physics, is saying about the world”. But what North means by “structure in this sense” is not exactly, and also not exactly not, what people mean by that word in the discourses of “Structural Realism”, or “Spacetime Structural Realism”, or in recent discussions of theoretical equivalence that rely heavily on formal methods from model theory, or category theory, or what have you. Her notion is more complicated, and more subtle, and more delicate, and more open, and more intuitive, and more useful (I think) than what one finds in those other literatures. And the conclusions that she comes to are sometimes similar to the sorts of conclusions that are commonly endorsed in those other literatures, but sometimes very different from them.

Have a look (for example) at Section 4 of Chapter 3—which is paradigmatic of the loving and scrupulous attention to detail that I so much admire about this book—and in which North compares and contrasts her own way of following the lead of “structure” with various ways in which other authors follow the lead of “symmetry”.

Anyway, for all of the reasons alluded to above, this is not the sort of a book that is susceptible of being summed up—and it should already be clear that precisely this resistance to summation is a large part of what I like about it. What I want to do in the remainder of this review (then) will be more in the nature of an invitation. And I want to focus, in particular, on one or two of the points at which North comes to conclusions that are strikingly at odds with what usually passes for received wisdom in the foundations of physics.

The 7th and final chapter of North’s book is a clear, sustained, and compelling argument to the effect that much of the current literature on the equivalence of fundamental physical theories is—from the standpoint of anything that deserves the name of realism—profoundly misguided.

The chapter begins with a beautiful quote from Hertz—a quote which nicely sums up the spirit of this chapter, and (indeed) of the book as a whole—which reads:

A doubt which makes an impression on our mind cannot be removed by calling it metaphysical; every thoughtful mind as such has needs which scientific men are accustomed to denote as metaphysical.

Here’s an example of a concrete application of that spirit:

North notes that the Schrodinger and Heisenberg pictures of quantum mechanics are widely treated in discussions of the foundations of physics as obvious and paradigmatic examples of equivalent physical theories—as two versions (that is) of the same set of claims about how the world is. She quotes Larry Sklar as saying “Hardly anyone would deny that the Schrodinger and Heisenberg ‘representations’ are, indeed, representations of one and the same theory, despite the fact that in the former the state function varies with time and the operators do not and in the latter the reverse is the case”.

But North denies it—or (at any rate) she sees very clearly, with her usual meticulous qualifications, how “on one natural understanding, they present different pictures of the physical world”.

Let me try to say—a little louder (as it were)—what I think she has in mind here. Imagine that somebody—call her Darlene—proposes the following fundamental physical theory of the world: The world consists of a single particle in a very high-dimensional space. And the single law of the motion of this particle is that nothing ever happens—the single law of the motion of this particle (that is) is that it remains exactly where it is from t = - infinity to t = + infinity. We will be likely to say: “But that’s preposterous! How can that possibly be the true fundamental theory of a world that is anything at all like the one we live in? Where are all the wars and the dance performances and the baseball games and the love stories and the elections and what have you—not to mention the tables and chairs and rocks and buildings?” And suppose that Darlene responds that all of them are in there—that all that’s going on here is that the “mapping” or the “bridge principles” that connect the fundamental language of her theory with the everyday language of dance performances and baseball games and so on are very complicated, and very time-dependent—much more complicated, and much more time-dependent than the bridge principles that we are used to.

What are we to make of this theory? We might be inclined to simply dismiss it as unintelligible. We might be inclined to insist (for example) that—as a matter of some kind of conceptual or metaphysical necessity—the world can only change when there are changes going on in the arrangement of the totality of the fundamental stuff.[1] Or we might grant that Darleen’s theory is intelligible—but doubt that her theory could possibly turn out to be the best that science can do, at the end of the day, by way of explaining our empirical experience. We might argue (for example) that a departure from the manifest image of the world on anything like the scale that her theory involves is going to call for an extraordinarily detailed and compelling justification—and that no such justification has yet been hinted at. What’s clear (no matter how you slice it) is that Darleen’s theory is nuts. What’s clear is that this is not the sort of theory that anybody is going to be inclined to take seriously.

And yet—and this is the punch line—the reader should note that Darleen’s theory is precisely the so-called Heisenberg picture of quantum mechanics!

Of course—and as North is careful to point out—“we can stipulate” [my italics] “that the Heisenberg representation is just a different, roundabout way of saying all the same things that the Schrodinger one does . . . . (This may even be something like the standard view in physics.) Yet even though this ensures that the two are in a sense metaphysically equivalent . . . only one of them directly represents what is going on physically”.

Here's a related example, which North also briefly touches on:

Imagine that I am teaching a course on classical mechanics. At a certain point in the course, I introduce the students to the formalism of classical phase space—and I show them how the complete trajectory of a classical N-particle system can be represented by a single curve in the 6N-dimensional phase space of such a system, and I point to some of the nice mathematical features of the phase-space representation, and I give examples of how those features can be immensely useful in solving certain classical-mechanical problems.

After the class—a student approaches me and says: “Wow—this was an amazing lecture. It completely blew my mind. It completely changed my life. I now understand that we really live in a 6N-dimensional physical space—not the 3-dimensional one that I had always taken for granted”.

This student—it should go without saying—is simply mistaken.

Afterwards, another student—perhaps a slightly more mathematically sophisticated one—approaches me and says: “Wow—this was an amazing lecture. It completely blew my mind. It completely changed my life. I now understand that there is simply no fact of the matter as to whether our world consists of N particles moving around in a 3-dimensional space or a single particle moving around in a 6N-dimensional space. What you have just shown us in class (after all) is that those two representations are fully isomorphic to one another. What you have just shown us in class (to put it another way) is that the claim that our world consists of N particles moving around in a 3-dimensional space and the claim that our world consists of one particle moving around in a 6N-dimensional space are not really different claims at all. And the notion that they are different claims—which I had always taken for granted—turns out to have been silly”.

And it seems to me—and it seems to North (if I read her correctly) as well—that it should go without saying that this student is mistaken too.

What I should say to these students—what I should explain to these students—is that phase space, as it is employed in classical mechanics, is an explicitly and self-consciously “roundabout” way of talking about systems of classical particles. It is useful for all sorts of practical and theoretical and calculational purposes—but it is not meant to be taken as a direct or literal picture of what is going on. And I should go on to emphasize that a theory according to which the most direct and most faithful and the most literal representation of the world involved a 6N-dimensional fundamental physical space would amount to a very different set of claims about how the world is, and to a wild and unprecedented and preposterous departure from everything that we have learned from our everyday empirical experience.

There are (on the other hand) more difficult cases. In Chapter 4 (for example) North wants to argue that the Newtonian version of classical mechanics, which is based on force, is inequivalent to the Lagrangian version, which is based (so she suggests) on energy—and (moreover) that the Lagrangian version is the better one.

And this raises a number of interesting questions.

There is (to begin with) a question about what it might even mean to assert of one version of classical particle mechanics that it is better—in the sense of representing the world more accurately or more directly or more perspicuously than some other one. It’s one thing to prefer a version of classical mechanics which represents the world as a collection of N particles moving around in a 3-dimensional space to a version that represents the world as a single particle moving around in a 6N-dimensional space—since the latter, but not the former, would apparently amount to a wild and completely gratuitous departure from the manifest image of the world. But the business of comparing Newtonian mechanics with Lagrangian mechanics—when both are considered as accounts of the motions of particles in 3-dimensional space—feels like it’s going to be a lot more dicey. The only thing we know for sure about these theories (after all) is that neither one of them, considered as anything in the neighborhood of a complete and fundamental theory of the physical world, can possibly be true. And it’s not entirely obvious how it might be argued that one of them is somehow less wrong than the other. And so it seems like something needs to be said—by way of introducing a conversation like this—about what it is that we are even asking when we ask, as North seems to be asking, which one of them is the superior guide to the real nature of the world.

Never mind. Let’s imagine that we have some more or less adequate sense of what it is that we are asking, and consider how we might attempt to answer it. North focuses our attention on the fact that the fundamental Newtonian-mechanical equation of motion takes a particularly simple form in Cartesian co-ordinates—whereas the Euler-Lagange equations, which are formulated from the word go in so-called generalized co-ordinates, take exactly the same form across a much wider variety of systems for assigning addresses to points in a 3-dimensional space. And she reads this difference—together with the fact that these two versions of classical mechanics are presumed to be empirically equivalent to one another—as evidence that the Newtonian version has more structure than we have any good scientific reasons for attributing to the world.

North suggests that this excess structure can be traced back to the Newtonian assumptions that all of the forces in the world arise exclusively between pairs of particles, that they are conservative, and that they satisfy certain other simple symmetry-principles. There is no such assumption, explicit or otherwise, in the Lagrangian formulation—and this is why the business of incorporating constraints is so straightforward in the Lagangian formalism, and so notoriously awkward in the Newtonian one. This is why (for example) it is so much easier to solve for the motion of a bead constrained to move along a wire in the Langrangian formalism than it is in the Newtonian one.

But I get puzzled here as well. Isn’t it one of the great empirical lessons of physics that, in so far as we can tell at present, at the fundamental level, there are (as a matter of fact) no such things as “constraints”? Isn’t it one of the great empirical lessons of physics that, in so far as we can tell at present, these so-called “constraints” invariably resolve themselves, at the microscopic level, into something more like interactions between pairs of particles?[2] This (I take it) is precisely the sort of thing that Feynman had in mind when he said:

If, in some cataclysm, all of scientific knowledge were to be destroyed, and only one sentence passed on to the next generations of creatures, what statement would contain the most information in the fewest words? I believe it is the atomic hypothesis . . . that all things are made of atoms—little particles that move around in perpetual motion, attracting each other when they are a little distance apart, but repelling upon being squeezed into one another.

And if it is among the empirical lessons of physics that all of the fundamental interactions are something relevantly like interactions between pairs of particles (see, relatedly,, endnote 2), and if that lesson in not built into Lagrangian formalism in the way that it is built into the Newtonian one, then the situation would seem to be not that the Newtonian formalism has too much structure, but that the Lagrangian one has too little.

North seems to me—very uncharacteristically—a little evasive on this point. She says:

It took the case of the pendulum, idealized as a constrained single-particle system, to bring out the core differences between the theories. However, you might think that only the behavior of free—unconstrained—particles can be a guide to the true nature of a world’s physical space. (Perhaps because constraints themselves do not seem to be fundamental things.) And you might worry that if we do limit our focus to the behavior of free particles, then the two theories will indicate the same kind of physical space after all.

My sentiments exactly. But the following paragraph reads:

I take it that in general, the behavior of free particles is not enough to convey a complete picture of the world according to a physical theory. We also need information about particle interactions, which in the case of the pendulum are being idealized as constraints that operate external to the system.

And here, yet again, I get confused. In the first paragraph it seems that what North means by “free particles” are particles that are not subject to any fundamental external constraints—which is to say that what she means by “free particles” is just “particles”, since nature simply does not contain any fundamental external constraints. But in the second paragraph “free” seems to be slipping back in the direction of its more familiar meaning of “non-interacting”. And while it is certainly correct, on this more familiar construal, that “the behavior of free particles is not enough to convey a complete picture of the world according to a physical theory”, the assimilation of “constraints” to “interactions” seems, from a foundational point of view, very misleading. There are (again) plenty of interactions in the world—but it is an enormously important feature of the structure of the sort of world that we seem to live in that none of them, in so far as we know, when you get right down to it, take the form of “constraints”.

Anyway, all this, as I said above, should be treated as something along the lines of an invitation. The book got me thinking, afresh, about hundreds of basic questions—and I suspect it will have much the same salutary effect on the field as a whole. Maybe I’ll finish up by mentioning, more or less at random, just one more.

I was reminded, reading North’s book, that I have never been entirely clear about the metaphysical status of “force” in Newtonian Mechanics. North often speaks as if “forces” and “particles” are more or less on an ontological par with one another in the Newtonian-Mechanical picture of the world—but the more she did that the more I found myself wishing I could ask her exactly why. Shouldn’t there be a simpler and more parsimonious and more attractive way of picturing the fundamental ontology of Newtonian Mechanics as consisting, instead, exclusively of particles? Isn’t there a way of picturing the particles (that is) as producing accelerations in one another directly, without the mediation of anything else? The idea (I guess) would be that there is a single fundamental Newtonian law of motion which specifies the magnitude and the direction of the acceleration of any particular material particle, at any time, as a definite function of the positions and the intrinsic properties (mass, charge, etc.,) of all of the particles in the world at that time. This would simply do away with the middleman of “force”. “Force” would be demoted (that is) to a piece of bookkeeping—to a way of concisely coding up the functions I referred to above—and would amount to nothing at all like a piece of the fundamental furniture of the universe.

I wonder if anything would turn out to be wrong with that.


[1] This might sound like a requirement to the effect that the language of tables and chairs and baseball games and so on supervenes on the fundamental language of physics. But it’s not—it’s a good deal stronger (in fact) than that. The complexity and the time-dependence of the mapping from the fundamental language of Darleen’s theory to the language of tables and chairs and baseball games are both perfectly compatible (after all) with the requirements of supervenience.

[2] I’m not sure I know exactly what I mean by “something more like interactions between pairs of particles”. I guess I mean something like interactions between pairs of localized dynamical degrees of freedom—particulate, or field-theoretic, or what have you. Something (you might say) like “no action without reaction”