When a scientist says that neurons predict, drosophila decide, plants choose, or bacteria cooperate, how should we interpret those claims? This is the central question of Carrie Figdor's provocative book, in which she argues we should understand scientists literally (or, more precisely, we should take them Literally). The claim that neurons predict may be false, but predict refers to the same kind of action whether it is being performed by a child, a dog, a pea plant, or a neuron.
Don't be confused. Figdor isn't going to tell you whether neurons actually predict, or whether drosophila really decide. She also isn't going to tell you what predict or decide refer to (or what the words mean). With a subtitle like The Proper Domain of Psychological Predicates, a reader might be excused for thinking that Figdor will answer these questions, but the goal of her book is otherwise: to show we are currently in a state of conceptual revision when it comes to psychological predicates, moving from anthropocentrism toward inclusiveness and generality. Figdor defends a view she calls "Literalism" and she defines it as: "in contexts standardly interpreted as fact-stating, uses of psychological predicates to ascribe capacities to entities in this wider range are best interpreted as literal with sameness of reference" (5). Literalism entails a radical continuity thesis, and emphasizes similarities while discounting differences across a diversity of living organisms. Although the thesis can be viewed as a corrective to accounts of cognition that emphasize human superiority and uniqueness, Figdor's focus on similarity at the expense of difference might conceal as much as it reveals.
In the first third of the book Figdor argues that many claims that nonhumans have psychological properties are warranted, which helps to establish the conceptual change thesis. The second third is an argument by elimination that proposes and critiques alternatives to Literalism. The final third considers two objections to Literalism -- that it threatens a mechanistic understanding of the mind by suggesting the existence of homunculi heads, and that it threatens human moral superiority by suggesting agency and personhood is widely distributed among living organisms.
To begin, Figdor defends the conceptual change thesis by considering four cases: plants, bacteria, drosophila and neurons. She argues that in these four cases concepts such as predict, decide, choose, cooperate, and communicate have been used by biologists and neuroscientists to describe the performance of these systems in a way that promotes the science, because the uses offer predictive power or robust models. Figdor's defense of the conceptual change thesis requires that she performs a careful dance in which she demonstrates both that scientific investigations can lead us to revise our concepts and at the same time tell us to whom (or what) the concepts apply. The use of these concepts in models of nonhuman beings vindicates their use, while at the same time challenging an anthropocentric understanding of them. We should no longer understand the use of terms such as prefer to have all the connotations, associations, or properties that they have when we use them in casual folk psychology. Psychological predicates, as used by scientists, refer to a wider set of phenomenon, of which the folk psychological understanding comprises only a subset. Figdor rejects the idea that we should coin new terms that distinguish between the human variety of "prefer" and the neuronal variety of "prefer", because such a move would fail to reveal the deep continuities that she thinks exist.
In the middle third of the book we find the core of Figdor's argument by elimination for Literalism, which involves an inference from the cases presented in the first third of the book to psychological predicates more generally. Scientists use a range of psychological predicates in their descriptions of many phenomenon, saying things like "neurons believe and can be surprised". What should we make of such claims? Figdor offers us four possible interpretations: Nonsense, Metaphor, Technical, and Literal. The first three fail, so the fourth wins the day.
The Nonsense view, attributed to Bennett and Hacker, is that these uses of psychological predicates outside of the human case don't make sense. Figdor's reply here treads on familiar ground. The Metaphor view, according to which psychological terms used in nonhuman contexts retain their common meanings but are used metaphorically when applied by scientists in scientific contexts (e.g., not in the popular press), isn't attributed to any one person (though Figdor thinks Sellars expressed the view). Figdor critiques Metaphor as question begging.
The last competitor, the Technical view, initially struck me as the most plausible contender, and as a view that is widely held. In articulating the Technical view, Figdor divides it into two variants: the Technical-Behaviorist variant, according to which "terms refer to patterns of behavior", and the Exsanguinated Property variant, according to which "[terms] refer to properties or capacities of nonhumans that are not fully cognitive" (130). What Figdor doesn't propose as a competitor is that terms refer to properties that may be fully cognitive (i.e., "full-blooded") and are adjacent to the folk psychological or technical use of the terms as applied to humans. Adjacent does not entail exsanguinated; the capacities might be similar without one being a lesser version of the other. Since comparative psychology widely accepts the existence of different varieties of cognitive capacities across species, the adequacy of Figdor's argument by elimination is called into question.
The Technical-Behaviorist variant is described as adopting the Intentional Stance when it comes to nonhumans, and not using the Intentional Stance when it comes to humans. Figdor notes that this understanding of the Intentional Stance is not Dennett's, but instead reflects the idea that there are genuine mental states had only by humans, and mere patterns of behavior in other systems that can be identified by taking the intentional stance toward them. Of course, Dennett would deny a distinction between genuine and faux psychological attributions. In her analysis of this position, Figdor writes, "I do not find a non-question-begging motivation for the Technical-Behaviorist's referential distinction nor a non-question-begging principle for drawing it. The view seems to depend ultimately on the fact that we're human and we have a history of downgrading nonhumans" (139).
The Exsanguinated Property variant is cashed out as "psychological predications to nonhumans pick out capacities or properties that are in some sense lesser or deflated versions of the human capacities or properties" (139). Here Figdor has in mind claims such as Dennett's that we don't attribute "fully-fledged" belief to brain parts (or to animals, for that matter), and I suspect also comparative psychologists' use of scare quotes or modifications of technical terms, such as the "episodic-like memory" of scrub jays. Figdor again objects to the coining of new terms to refer to nonhuman variants of these capacities, this time on the grounds that doing so leads to a naïve anthropocentrism and risks creating a new Great Chain of Being.
While the book isn't a book on comparative psychology, more attention to that field would have helped flesh out the argument by elimination. For one thing, work in that field has shown that while some psychological predicates are anthropocentric -- such as hunger, fear, pleasure, memory -- other psychological terms were only discovered after study of nonhuman species, such as echolocation and magnetoreception. In some cases, it is the discovery of a capacity in one species that leads us to see it in humans. For example, immediately after Donald Griffin discovered echolocation in the bat, it was thought to be a psychological predicate that didn't apply to humans. But we now have some reason to think that humans also have the capacity for echolocation, just not in the same way that bats do. Not all psychological predicates are anthropocentric.
In addition, comparative psychologists have addressed the worry that anthropocentrism leads to unwarranted hierarchical thinking, going back to C. Lloyd Morgan. Morgan's challenge is: "To interpret animal behavior one must learn also to see one's own mentality at levels of development much lower than one's top-level of reflective selfconsciousness. It is not easy, and savors somewhat of paradox" (Morgan 1930, 250). Morgan's challenge has been taken up by contemporary scientists such as Sara Shettleworth, who insist that comparative psychologists recognize that much human action is underwritten by associative and emergent processes.
Furthermore, in the philosophy of animal minds, the higher and lower talk has been analyzed and found to be wanting. While Figdor refers to some of this literature, her worry about a new great Chain of Being could have been addressed in the context of the critiques of higher and lower talk in comparative psychology (here I'm thinking of work by Sean Allen-Hermanson, Cameron Buckner, Mike Dacey, Simon Fitzpatrick, and Irina Mikhalevich). The sorts of conversations that are being had in comparative psychology and the philosophy of animal minds suggest that there is a kind of anthropocentrism that need not lead to hierarchy. This is good news, given the fact that our concepts will always reflect our perspectives. Science is a human project, after all.
In the final third of the book Figdor considers two objections to Literalism. In her response to the worry that Literalism is inconsistent with mechanistic explanation because it implies that parts have the same types of properties as wholes, thereby threatening explanation, Figdor reviews familiar debates about homuncular functionalism. In her response to the worry that Literalism will lead to a widening of the circle of moral agents and patients, making it difficult for humans to retain a position of moral superiority, Figdor deflects the worry while admitting the consequence. She thinks that while in the long term we will have to acknowledge that anthropocentrism in respect to moral status is not tenable, in the short term we have means for drawing social distinctions between us and nonhumans. For a time, as humanity adjusts to the changing scientific landscape, Figdor suggests we can continue the practice of justifying human exceptionalism.
Keeping both similarities and differences in mind is a tricky business, but it can help us respect the continuity of the mental while appreciating the variety of minds on this planet. While some may see Figdor as falling too far on the continuity side, her book counters work that might fall too far on the discontinuity side. For example, in Peter Carruthers' Human and Animal Minds: The Consciousness Questions Laid to Rest (OUP 2019) we have an opposing thesis -- rather than moving away from anthropocentrism and refining our terms in a more inclusive way, Carruthers urges us to accept that psychological predicates such as "consciousness" refer only to humans, and to understand the question of animal consciousness as committing a category mistake. Figdor's book offers arguments against such a position, and the two books together make for an interesting conversation.
If humankind has suffered "three humiliations" (Shleim 2012) -- the Copernican theory that the Earth is not the center of the universe, the Darwinian theory that humans evolved from common ancestors with apes, and the Freudian theory that we have limited control over and knowledge of our psychological lives -- then perhaps psychological continuity is the fourth. (182)
Psychological continuity isn't the same as psychological identity, and seeing difference without perceiving it as inferior may perhaps be the next challenge we face in our attempts to better understand -- and value -- the diversity of minds around us.