Pierre Gassendi and the Birth of Early Modern Philosophy

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Antonia LoLordo, Pierre Gassendi and the Birth of Early Modern Philosophy, Cambridge University Press, 2006, 294pp., $75.00 (hbk), ISBN 0521866138.

Reviewed by Gianni Paganini, Università del Piemonte Orientale


This book is the first comprehensive treatment in English of the philosophical system and scientific ideas of Pierre Gassendi, an important author of the seventeenth century who was in contact with such notable philosophers and scientists as Galileo, Mersenne, Descartes, and Hobbes, and influenced early modern thinkers such as Locke, Leibniz, and Newton. The way chosen by Antonia LoLordo to get a systematic overview of Gassendi's work is to focus mainly on his magnum opus, the Syntagma philosophicum, published posthumously and completed by his disciples with the materials Gassendi was working on when he died. This does not prevent LoLordo from also examining less systematic previous works, which are just as important for shedding light on some notable features of Gassendi's philosophy. First, the account of the Exercitationes paradoxicae permits her to see how Gassendi used sceptical tools in order to raise issues about the themes of traditional Aristotelian metaphysics; secondly, the polemic with Fludd was the occasion for Gassendi’s distancing himself from Renaissance themes such as world soul, with its danger of falling into pantheism; and thirdly, the detailed and bitter discussion with Descartes reveals Gassendi's rigorous empiricist approach, pointing to a body-based  psychology, bordering on overt materialism. To the pure Cartesian mens Gassendi opposed himself as true caro (flesh). Lastly, the examination of the three letters De motu uncovers how tight the bond was between Gassendi and the new seventeenth century science: in those letters, Gassendi gives a correct formulation of the inertia principle, adheres to the Galilean law of fallen bodies, and contrives an experimental proof of the principle of the relativity of motion.

In this field, Antonia LoLordo follows Gassendi's activities right into his ideal laboratory, even though most of her book is devoted to the 'system' contained in the Syntagma. The book Animadversiones in decimum librum Diogenis Laertii (where Gassendi published a first version of his epicurea anastasis as a philological commentary on the texts transmitted by Diogenes Laertius) is substantially put aside, with the explanation that in the later edition of the Opera omnia, only the philological parts were retained, because the properly philosophical aspects had been superseded by the new Syntagma. Furthermore, the doxographic work De vita et moribus Epicuri is barely mentioned, while LoLordo leaves aside the manuscript drafts for the projected work titled De vita et doctrina Epicuri, some of which were used to complete the posthumous Syntagma.

LoLordo's book stands out in the already copious bibliography on Gassendi for its plain and well-balanced treatment of all the main issues tackled by the philosopher. Following the numerous partitions in which the Syntagma is articulated, the book points out the systematic nature of Gassendi's thought: theory of knowledge and doctrine of perception, theory of signs, space and time, atoms and causes, bodies and motion, phenomena of generation and life, corporeal soul, metaphysics of body, immaterial soul and knowledge, and God are the main topics LoLordo covers in her chapters, using a clear and orderly scheme, close in spirit (even though not literally) to that Gassendi himself used in the Syntagma. Only ethics and politics are left out.  Here LoLordo refers to Lisa Sarasohn's book, although that book still needs some complements and improvements (for example, Sarasohn merely mentions Gassendi's important commentary on Epicurus's Ratae sententiae).

The main innovation contained in this book (in comparison with the rich literature that has followed Gregory's and Bloch's books) concerns the central thesis more than the individual points of the treatment. We might say that LoLordo places herself half way between the two opposite interpreters, Bloch and Osler: the former sees in Gassendi's atomistic philosophy a hidden tendency towards a materialist and autonomous conception of physics, in line with his basic Epicurean inspiration; the latter points out the orthodoxy of the corrections Gassendi introduced in Epicurean atomism so as to accord it with a vision of divinity, emphasizing, according to Osler, voluntarism, in line with the Anglo-Saxon tradition that stressed the contingency of the world order dependent on God's free and creative act.

LoLordo describes Bloch's thesis as attributing to Gassendi a position of "double truth" so that reason and faith end up contradicting each other, and the latter yields to the former only for reasons of authority or of opportunism. Against this reading, LoLordo claims that Gassendi's scepticism and probabilism prevent a conflict between reason and faith: it is not the case that reason demonstrates the opposite, or the impossibility, of faith, but rather that reason gives probable arguments, which are less robust than revealed ones. This is the case concerning: the creation of atoms, the (finite or infinite) extent of the universe, whether the world had a beginning, and the immortality of the soul. According to LoLordo, the tensions internal to Gassendi's thought are in reality much less strong and lacerating, less dramatic, than Bloch would have them. The author acknowledges that the corrections to atomism introduced by Gassendi for religious or theological reasons do not have any real impact on his natural-philosophical account of the world; they are left nearly isolated from the rest of his thought. So, after analysing the transition, from the Disquisitio to the Syntagma, in Gassendi's views about the immateriality of soul, and after showing that Gassendi ends up claiming in the latter work, in a rather embarrassing way, the opposite of the thesis he expressed in the former, LoLordo concludes that the new doctrine has no more explanatory value than the one Gassendi had attributed to the Cartesian psychology, which was centred around the immaterial mens. Gassendi had already considered the latter as void of knowledge content. It is really difficult for any historian to take the reversal from the Disquisitio to the Syntagma seriously: "Indeed, it is difficult to know how seriously to take these three arguments [for the immateriality of soul], especially the argument from cognition of universals. For Gassendi does not appeal to grasp of genuine universals elsewhere in the Syntagma" (p. 236). Moreover, it does not seem that Gassendi himself took the arguments referring to immateriality much into account: "Gassendi's switch in views brings together the ontologies of faith and natural philosophy without making any real impact at all on his natural-philosophical account of the mind" (p. 236).

On the other hand, against Osler's interpretation, the author of this book thinks that there is in Gassendi's work not much evidence in favour of his holding a voluntarist theology and that this takes up a relatively minor place in his philosophy: if Gassendi had considered it as so crucial, he would have articulated it much more often and much more clearly. In other passages of the book (for example the one about the organizing power of seeds), LoLordo reacts to the emphasis Osler puts on the non-mechanist and overtly finalistic aspects in Gassendi: "I do not think," writes LoLordo, "that Gassendi intends his account of generation to appeal to genuine final causes aside from God's intentions" (p. 200). And a little later: "A complete account, however, would not need to advert to anything but atomic motions and the powers of molecules. It is a consequence of the limitations of the human cognitive capacities that we cannot give a complete, nonteleological account of generation" (p. 201). More generally, LoLordo shows in a convincing way that, even if Gassendi admits God's action of creation and conservation, he is as concerned to stress the autonomy and efficacy of the secondary causes, not only for physical, but also for theological and moral reasons. This view has relevance for the problem of "vis motrix" that is intrinsic to atoms. The claim that vis motrix is due to God's creation has been read by Osler as a denial of the genuine activity of matter. In reality, writes LoLordo,  "Gassendi does not simply intend the claim that matter was put into motion by God: He intends the stronger claim that atoms contain within themselves a source of motion" (p. 143), even if that itself depends, in the final analysis, on the first cause that is God.

Simplifying the author's interpretation, we might say that she points out the autonomy that physics takes on in Gassendi's philosophy, even if she does not agree with any materialist reading, much less an atheistic one. More generally, it is actually this displacement between the ontological and the epistemological level that "saves" Gassendi from the implications that would have carried him towards materialism. The fact that we cannot think of God but by analogy with a human figure or with the body, or that we cannot represent mind but in an empiricist way and in terms of material images, does not mean that God is material or that mind is really corporeal. The theme of the limits of human knowledge works to take away exclusivity from processes and representations that occur within their boundaries, but cannot be extended to realities that are radically different.

On the whole, LoLordo stresses the novelty of the view of Gassendi that comes from her research: a Gassendi who is much more metaphysical than empiricist. For example, about the efficacy of atoms by virtue of their "vis motrix", the author writes: "Here we are far from a picture of Gassendi the empiricist, embracing atomism for its practical explanatory value. Rather, we see Gassendi addressing what is for us a paradigmatically metaphysical issue that arose out of a dissatisfaction with both Aristotelian and neo-Platonist accounts and coming up with a theory that “has virtually nothing to do with observation and and everything to do with the requirements of his moral and religious world view" (p. 182).

In reality, the ghost of materialism is not entirely exorcized and even resurfaces below the apparently weaker thesis about the autonomy of secondary causes as well as matter. This is evident in one of the concluding chapters, which is specifically devoted to "The Metaphysics of Body" (p. 208 ff.). Even if Gassendi carefully distinguishes between immaterial substances (such as God and angels) and material realities, it is clear to him that a strict equivalence between substance and body holds, at least within the boundaries of philosophy, although it is still not clear at what level it works, whether at the macroscopic one of composite bodies or at the microscopic level of atoms. Despite all the precautionary clauses precluding an extension of this approach to God and immaterial souls, for Gassendi the only true metaphysics that can be articulated without any appeal to the external help of faith is a metaphysics of body or matter. This admission reintroduces at a deeper and more basic level the problem of the "tensions" Bloch stressed.

We need to say, first of all, that the representation made by LoLordo of Bloch's reading in terms of "double truth" is too simplistic and uncharitable towards the French scholar. Instead, he showed how Gassendi, willing to avoid the impasse of mere contradiction contained in the thesis of "double truth", developed solutions and elaborations that went well beyond the simple "juxtaposition", and went so far as to work out metaphysical concepts that deeply modified the materialistic Epicurean foundations of his theory. On this ground, Bloch suggested not only a complex interpretation (which LoLordo judges "ultimately unsustainable", although "subtle and attractive", p. 245) of Gassendi's philosophy, but also reconstructed its internal genealogy, following its genesis through the different phases which are witnessed in the several extant manuscripts. In particular, Bloch showed how Gassendi, after a more "physical" approach to atomism, was pushed to revise the entire framework of his philosophy, because of the "relative soundness, and perhaps an unexpected one, that atomist materialism, when renewed and deepened in contact with Galilean science, took on at his eyes," (Bloch p. 431). Not by chance, at the center of Bloch's genetic reconstruction stood the quite long interruption (from 1637 to 1641) of the fundamental book "De Caussis" and the writing of book XXI, "De Deo", the real pillar of Gassendian metaphysics, which contains the solutions that the Disquisitio seemed to rule out. This dramatic transition marks the final crisis of the previously adopted pattern of "juxtaposition" and reveals instead the elaboration of a new "system", due to the awareness of the dangers intrinsic to the coherent development of Epicurean philosophy.

In his book, La philosophie de Gassendi, Bloch tended to emphasize this crisis, finding "two opposing systems" within Gassendi's work, even claiming that, properly speaking, "there is no unique Gassendian system". LoLordo stresses, on the contrary, the unity of Gassendi's thought, even though, in the comparison of the Disquisitio with the later Syntagma, she too is obliged to recognize a complete, and unjustified, reversal of positions -- for example about such a crucial theme as the immateriality of soul. It is a pity that, having decided to treat Gassendi's thought mostly in the light of its final presentation (the Syntagma) -- hence neglecting the long and tormented path of its elaboration through the previous manuscript drafts -- LoLordo cannot either verify or disprove Bloch's hypothesis (even though she mentions it) about a major rift in the evolution of Gassendi's philosophy. A final criticism: the author cites and uses only critical literature written in French and in English, ignoring scholarship in Italian and in German, even though these two philosophical cultures have paid much attention in the last three decades to the philosopher of Digne.