Planning, Time, and Self-Governance: Essays in Practical Rationality

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Michael E. Bratman, Planning, Time, and Self-Governance: Essays in Practical Rationality, Oxford University Press, 2018, 272pp., $29.95 (pbk), ISBN 9780190867867.

Reviewed by Elijah Millgram, University of Utah


One might well suppose that a philosopher's collection of essays -- this is Michael Bratman' third -- would be simply a progress report, in this case on an evolving view of the role of planning in our lives. Of course it is that, and avowedly, but not simply: throughout his career, Bratman has made a point of intervening in debates that bear on his own position, and when he addresses the two related discussions that take center stage here, it exposes a reemerging and very important disagreement about the ground rules in philosophy of logic.

In Bratman's view, part of understanding what plans are and what they do for us is to see a handful of requirements as constitutive: once a plan has been adopted, it governs your further behavior, and you need a special reason to give it up; plans are typically initially quite sketchy, but come the appropriate time, they have to be filled in with workable subsidiary plans; if you have more than one plan at a time (or when you have several of those subsidiary plans), they have to be coexecutable; they have to make sense against the background of your beliefs about the world around you. These and like requirements Bratman understands as demands of practical rationality; if you shrug them off, you're exhibiting yourself to be incompetent when it comes to reasoning about what to do.

As our beginnings of a list indicate, the demands that planning makes on us are more elaborate than what I'll call the bare requirement of means-end consistency: that if you're committed to attaining an objective, if some particular means is clearly necessary for doing so, and if you both refuse to adopt it and to give up on the goal, it counts as a lapse. In the discussions that Bratman has taken it upon himself to engage, it appears as almost the solely invoked formal constraint on practical rationality, and we'll get back to that fact about it shortly. However, his more elaborate requirements on planning commit one to some version of the bare requirement.

Turning to the first of those two debates, in this volume Bratman is engaging an assortment of recent voices that acknowledge the bare requirement, but insist that it is not properly practical: the requirements of rationality do not stick directly to the adoption of goals, to decisions, actions and so on, but rather to the beliefs that are in one way or another bound up with them. (In some of these theoretical constructs, the intentions are held to be beliefs, and in these cases the requirement is thought to stick to the intentions entirely in virtue of consistency requirements that apply to beliefs generally.) The position has come to be called "cognitivism," though unfortunately, since the label has built into it the retrograde and question-begging posture that only what affirms a proposition to be true can genuinely be a thought. Because the intent is reductionist -- to reduce whatever requirements of practical rationality are being acknowledged to requirements of theoretical rationality -- here I'll just refer to it as the reductionist program (practical-to-theoretical, understood).

Over the twentieth century, reductionism more broadly had an abysmal track record: one after another after another such enterprise failed, and the highly professionalized philosophers pursuing this reductionist program cannot be unaware of the pending inductive conclusion. So their opting doggedly to proceed regardless makes the question of their motivations unavoidable, and it is at this juncture that the back-and-forth with Bratman recorded here is revealing and even invaluable. If you are reading this book cover-to-cover, you will be seeing only one side of the exchange, in rather the manner of the dialogue in Yehoshua's Mr Mani; but, as in that novel, the drift of the conversation will be quite clear.[1] If you are new to Bratman's work, you might start off with chapter 5, "Agency, Time, and Sociality," which can serve as an introductory overview.

Let me pause to give you a bit of the flavor of the interchange. Long ago, Gilbert Harman observed that if you intend to do something, you think, to a first approximation, that you're actually going to do it: when someone tells you that his retirement is taken care of because he plans to win the lottery, that's a joke, one that turns on violating the conceptual feature of intention that Harman highlighted. But now, if you think you're going to do something, and the only way to do it is to do something else, which you know you won't -- well, in some very straightforward sense, what you believe is inconsistent, and that is where the allegedly practical irrationality of intending the ends but not the means bottoms out. Bratman's rejoinder is that, as someone famously put it, they know not what they do . . . at any rate sometimes, and nonetheless we don't forgive them. That is, when you in various ways misconstrue your intentions, your beliefs can be fully consistent even when your projected course of action is incoherent and, your obliviousness notwithstanding, we don't count it, or you, as rational. This is to respond to the reductionism on its own terms, by identifying an occasion on which a requirement of practical rationality fails to be cashed out into requirements of theoretical rationality.

There is a good deal more of this sort of back-and-forth, but let's go back to that bare requirement. Cases in which there is exactly one way to get something done, with no room for negotiation or fudging, are artificial and actually quite rare. A closely related issue is the defeasibility of means-end inference; in case this is your first encounter with the concept, when an inference is defeasible, even when it is all in order as far as what's already on the plate goes, you nevertheless need to be ready to back off and refrain from drawing the conclusion, should appropriate further facts or assessments turn up. Here's a toy illustration: we need to kill time until the demonstration is over and the public transit is running again; hanging out in this here pizza joint would be a way of killing time; let's hang out. That's fine, but defeasible: not if the pizza is really bad, and not if the health inspection suggests we're likely to get sick, and not if we'll have to talk to the other patrons, and not if the ambient music is really annoying . . . As that open-ended list suggests, the most striking logical feature of defeasible inference is that the well of potentially defeating conditions never runs dry; no matter how many of them you have surveyed, you can always think of more.

Thus when one is engaging in means-end reasoning, one's deliberative stance is normally something like the following: yes, this is a means to my end, but the instrumental inference is interrupted by one or another further consideration, and while I don't need to give up on the end (or for that matter on the implicit inference rule), I'm not going to draw the conclusion. Rather, I look at further options, maybe brainstorming a bit to find them, and also for other kinds of wiggle room.

Then why the widely shared preoccupation with the bare requirement? Evidently, it strikes participants in the debate as a useful simplification. In the first place, it seems to spare them the effort of taking on a philosophical treatment of defeasibility. ('Seems to': if the bare requirement characterizes a limit case, what remains after the indefinitely many defeaters and flexible option spaces have been finally -- and usually impossibly -- pared away, and if you generally only understand limits of this kind when you understand the series that leads to them, it is not a philosophically viable shortcut.) It does so in that the means-end inference has been shaped into what looks as much as possible like a step in a deduction (specifically, a modus ponens): deductive inference is regarded as philosophically safe, a domain in which you can characterize inferential correctness formally, and so without looking beyond the stated steps themselves. And now, the question of what one would be seeking to avoid, by taking this kind of cut-and-dried inference as the exclusive focus of one's attention, brings us around to the underlying disagreement between Bratman and his reductionist opponents.

Bratman's own way of thinking about rationality is not safe in this way. At the outset of his intellectual trajectory, he understood plans or intentions as a device for managing limited cognitive resources: when you adopt a plan, your further deliberations are conducted within the framework of the plan (unless an appropriate exception handler gets triggered), and so you can shelve thinking about all the options it excludes. Timna plans to spend the next couple of hours studying for her exam, and so she doesn't need to consider movies, the gym, impromptu shifts at the restaurant where she used to work and so on. That is, the early backstory for Bratman's planning approach was bounded rationality, the idea that you determine what counts as the right way to deliberate by considering not merely a formal problem description, but the cognitive abilities and (especially) limitations of the agent, along with challenges posed by the range of environments in which it has to function.[2] Abiding by the norms built into planning is rational due in part to this constraint: human beings cannot afford to reconsider everything, all the time. For our purposes, the relevant observation is that he argues about what rationality requires (in part) on the basis of how a human mind works -- or rather, how a mind that is limited in roughly the ways that human minds are has to work.

Over time, that initial orientation was supplemented with a very different kind of reason for taking the requirements built into planning agency seriously. This round involves a number of moving parts, and I'll proceed in laps. First, I'll recap why Bratman came to think that the earlier bounded rationality account wouldn't do the job he wanted. Then I'll introduce the second of the two debates that I mentioned at the outset, as the organizing themes of this collection. That will put us in a position to see what Bratman's supplementary reason is, and that in turn will allow us to say what really separates Bratman from both groups of his opponents.

Rule-utilitarians used to tell us that we shouldn't lie, because a policy of not lying has overall good outcomes; but now, what if you know that lying on this occasion will give rise to a good outcome? If what you really care about is overall utility, shouldn't the policy be overridden? (Aren't you just a "rule-worshipper" if you stick with it?) Bounded-rationality justifications for planning, Bratman thinks, find themselves in the same bind. Plans preempt moment-to-moment reconsideration of your course of action; human cognitive limitations justify a policy of not continually reconsidering; but now, if reconsidering on this occasion will improve your choice, shouldn't you bail on the plan and reconsider? (And if you don't, aren't you just a plan-worshipper, and stubbornly pigheaded, to boot?) Bratman hopes to show that not reconsidering your course of action can still be practically rational; so in this series of essays he is scouting out a further basis for complying, in the moment, with the requirements of planning agency.

At this point, Bratman proposes in addition to engage that second group of interlocutors; these claim that instrumental rationality is a "myth".[3] Instead of trying to explain away the bare means-end consistency requirement, by reducing it to requirements of theoretical rationality, myth theorists deny that there is any requirement to explain. First of all, it's held that what matters is what's valuable, rather than what your ends are; so the relation of means to end is beside the point, and Joseph Raz coyly talks only about "facilitation". And second, the means-invoking reasons are held not to constitute a distinctive category; there's no special type of prescriptive force that they share. Bratman's taking 'myth'-minimalism as a foil tells us what construction to put on this next argument.

Planning, Bratman argues, figures centrally and structurally into the way that humans govern themselves. (In this book, we are only given summaries of the more elaborate treatment in his earlier Structures of Agency.[4]) We care a great deal, he thinks, about being self-governed, both over time, and in the moment. So it is rational to take seriously and live up to the requirements involved in planning, instance by instance.

Just how do we care about self-governance -- that is, about one version of what other philosophers have discussed under the headings of, variously, autonomy, the full-fledged attribution of attitudes and actions to an agent, and, long ago, sophrosune? As we will shortly see, Bratman is prone to conceive of our interest in being self-governing as a preference or desire or end we have adopted, but I am uncomfortable about making such an end into a pivot of the argument. For then the form of the argument we have just rehearsed would be a means-end argument: self-government is our end; planning is a means to that end; so it is rational to plan. But Bratman is speaking not only to reductionists but to myth theorists, according to whom something's being your end is beside the point.[5] So putting this construction on the argument would make it out to beg the question against his opponents. At various points Bratman's discussion attempts to parry that objection by reminding his readers of the constitutive role of planning in self-governing agency; a constitutive means to an end, however, is still a means to an end.

A myth theorist balks at appeals to ends; even if he allows that planning facilitates self-governance, the argument that addresses him will have to turn, rather, on the value of self-governance. Now, Bratman does indeed announce, here and there, that running your own life is valuable. But he doesn't argue for the claim, and even if most of his readers are likely to concede the assessment, if it is going to be doing the heavy lifting in his justification of planning, an argument is owed. If it's not there, it would be unfair to read Bratman's argument as requiring it.

There is a different way to take the move, however, and if I am seeing the state of play correctly, it is to be preferred. Questions about what is rational are questions about, for instance, what you should conclude -- that is, they are questions about (as Bratman, following Frankfurt, puts it) where you (ought to) stand. Bratman has it that there is only an answer to a question as to where you stand on a particular practical matter if you are means-end consistent regarding it. So means-end consistency is not a means to the desired end of self-government, but rather part of the preliminary and required stage-setting for questions of practical rationality. And since in his earlier work Bratman has argued that plans play a central role in supporting full-fledged attribution of attitudes to human agents -- for instance, it counts as your conclusion, as what you really think, only because you drew it in accordance with high-level policies you adopted, policies that determine what will count as a reason for what -- planning more generally is a precondition of there being a question to raise about what is rational at all.

That is, what often enough appears on the face of it to be a means-end argument in Bratman's treatment we must in fact understand as transcendental. Now, Bratman himself balks at transcendental arguments here because, as a Kantian would say it, they invoke the necessary preconditions of the possibility of, in this case, agency, and Bratman wants to allow that you can be an agent without being a planning agent. No doubt there are such agents, but if you are a planning agent, then something may be a necessary precondition of the possibility of, say, full-fledged attitude attribution, for you. And so such arguments should not, in my own opinion, be neglected.

What is the status of the end of self-government, and how does it figure into Bratman's construction? It has a dual function, supporting both the rationality of the requirements on planning generally, and why it is that, on one particular occasion after another, you have reason actually to do what your plans prescribe. That is, it blocks the complaint of plan-worship by giving you a further reason, available at each moment, to do as your plan prescribes. Readers who know their way around the contemporary practical rationality literature will be reminded of the structural role of David Velleman's ever-present desire to know what one is doing, which is added onto whatever other considerations are available at any given time to tilt one's choices in the direction of intelligibility.[6] And readers who know their way around older literature will also be reminded of the prudential desire that Thomas Nagel, in The Possibility of Altruism, famously argued would fail to glue together one's temporal stages into an individual who is genuinely extended across time.[7]

How is that end itself to be accounted for? Bratman suggests that, when we look at planning agency as it appears in human beings, it supports an inference to the best explanation, namely, to the end of self-governance. But now, there are two ways to construe that inference. It might be thought of as practical reasoning to a new end, one that coheres with what a planning agent has on his stack already -- that is, as a step akin to Paul Thagard's 'inference to the most coherent plan'. Or it could be thought of as a theoretical inference, an abduction through which we arrive at a belief about what end planning agents have already. Let's consider both options.

A practical inference to the best explanation, one whose conclusion is adopting the end of self-government, is not likely to persuade interlocutors who already either think that there is no such thing as means-end rationality, because ends are neither here nor there, or are grudging reductionists about it. But over and above the tactical issue, there is a strategic consideration. If we have such an inferential tool in our repertoire, we should expect it to be used not just to derive this one end, but pervasively. And in that case, the picture of practical rationality we have to work with will turn out to be deeply, systematically different than the one that Bratman has been working with hitherto. Instead of means-end reasoning supplemented by the low-key adoption, in the first place on instrumental grounds, of plans, we will have ends and presumably plans regularly falling into place on coherentist grounds. It's hard to know what to say about the landscape of rationality that we can anticipate will emerge, but it would be a surprisingly large step to see Bratman take in so casual a manner.

In that case, let's try construing that inference to the best explanation as factual, informing us of an end that we already have, perhaps unawares. Here I hope my incredulity won't be taken amiss. Entire literary and cinematic genres (think of romance novels or thrillers) show us that a great many people yearn to be swept away by uncontrollable passions, or by urgent and unexpected circumstances.[8] A desire and the end one endorses are not the same thing, but with desires that are so dramatically expressed, it's hard to believe that self-government ends up as an end all that often. Again, people routinely put themselves in positions that degrade their ability to plan their lives, for instance by having children, or taking jobs that subject them to the arbitrary whims of their employers. (To be sure, I'm told that no one can really imagine how much children get in the way of planning until they actually have them.) And you will notice that over the past few decades, mobile telephones have accustomed people to rearranging their plans on the fly, almost on a minute-by-minute basis, which is to say that in Bratman's sense these are scarcely plans at all. (Yes, I know, they claim to be merely filling in the loosely specified plan rather than ditching it, but that's not how it looks to the lunch date they're standing up.) An inference to the best explanation suggests that self-governance is at most a low priority, and much lower than, say, convenience.

Bratman hopes to navigate between the horns of this dilemma by having it both ways: his "keystone claim" is that we indeed have the end, and it is locked into place, as the keystone of our planning agency, by that practical coherentist inference. I'm not myself sure, however, why that evades the liabilities on each of the horns of the dilemma, rather than incurring both of them simultaneously. He does at one point remark that he is limiting his discussion to those who do care about self-governance (p. 138). But that makes me worry that the scope of his treatment makes the treatment itself implausible. A great many people allow others to run their lives for them, and those who give them their marching orders quite properly expect instrumentally consistent planning and execution from their subordinates.[9] Surely what goes wrong when the battalion commander acting on orders fails to function as a planning agent is the same thing that has gone wrong when I, a putatively self-governing agent, fail to do so. Shouldn't the explanation of why each of us is irrational be the same explanation?

But now, remember where we are. Although I've been registering some pushback to Bratman's second round of explanations for the rationality of planning agency, what I want to bring to your attention is the common ground between both those rounds. Like bounded-rationality arguments, an argument turning on the functional role of a specially designated end in the planning agent has to do with how the agent (or his mind) is built, and on how he works. That is, both of these forms of argument are psychologistic, and let me pause to reintroduce that term.

Psychologistic logicians used to see the purview of logic as investigating and laying down the prescriptive laws of thought, and they took it to be obvious that, just as you would not write a repair manual for your car, or for that matter teach someone how to drive, without knowing how a car works, so you would not lay down the rules that are to govern reasoning without knowing a good deal about how the mind that is going to do the reasoning works. The reader should be warned that the psychologism wars of the nineteenth century were won by the antipsychologistic logicians, and that we have all been raised on polemical mischaracterizations of their opponents. (For instance, that they confused prescriptions with empirical generalizations; but John Stuart Mill, one of the most prominent logicians of his day, was quite clear that the laws of thought were to be understood as analogous to the laws of the state: as telling you how to think, not how people mostly do think.) Indeed, most of us have encountered the very notion, if at all, only as embedded within the phrase, "the psychologistic fallacy".[10]

At the outset, I suggested that the essays in this collection of Bratman's work were of special interest in that they brought to light a disagreement about the ground rules in philosophy of logic. Not that Bratman himself is pressing this point; on the contrary, his approach is the one recommended to judges, who are to prudently decide their cases on the narrowest possible grounds. But if we are after the Big Picture, what we see here is another stage in the reemergence of psychologistic philosophy of logic. And once we are looking at it that way, we can place the two camps of his interlocutors. The near-exclusive focus of some of them on the bare requirement of means-end consistency betrays the spirit of antipsychologism, and suggests their underlying philosophical motivations: practical reasoning is directed toward deciding what to do, and when it seems hard to understand how to do it right without thinking about how an agent works, it is natural to try to reduce practical rationality to theoretical rationality, for which antipsychologistic accounts are presumed to be available. And myth theory, with its insistence on accounting for rational choice in terms of what is valuable rather than an agent's ends, likewise appears to be an attempt to avoid invoking the workings of the mind of a person who is deciding what to do; it also bears the stamp of antipsychologism. Here I don't want to attempt to adjudicate the merits of the two approaches. Suffice it that this collection of Bratman's essays deserves the attention not only of specialists in planning agency but those of us who are attentively following the reappearance of psychologistic approaches to philosophy of logic.


I'm grateful to Teresa Burke, David Enoch, Svantje Guinebert, and Aubrey Spivey for comments on a draft, to the Hebrew University for a Lady Davis Fellowship, and to the University of Utah for support through a Sterling M. McMurrin Esteemed Faculty Award.

[1]A. B. Yehoshua, Mar Mani (Bnei Brak: HaKibbutz HaMeuhad, 2013).

[2]Markers of that initial concern are sprinkled throughout the present volume, as when Bratman reminds us that "reconsideration . . . takes time and uses other mental resources," that we aim "not to use deliberative resources inefficiently," and so on; (133); Herbert Simon, the acknowledged patron saint of bounded rationality, is given occasional nods in the footnotes (e.g., at 115n10).

[3]To keep the discussion manageable, I'll tie the conversation to just one such piece: Joseph Raz, "The Myth of Instrumental Rationality," Journal of Ethics and Social Philosophy 1(1), April 2005.

[4]Michael Bratman, Structures of Agency (Oxford: Oxford University Press, 2007).

[5]Almost entirely: there are qualifications I won't review here.

[6]See, e.g., J. David Velleman, How We Get Along (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2009).

[7]Thomas Nagel, The Possibility of Altruism (Princeton: Princeton University Press, 1978).

[8]Bratman does acknowledge, in a footnote (p. 138n16), that sometimes people want to lose control. In my own view, he is not giving that desire nearly enough weight in his discussion.

[9]For a discussion of such individuals and what has gone wrong with their lives, see Svantje Guinebert, Hörigkeit als Selbstboykott (Paderborn: Mentis, 2018).

[10]For a sociologically oriented account of the psychologism debate, see Martin Kusch, Psychologism (New York: Routledge, 1995); for the cultural context, see Fritz Ringer, The Decline of the German Mandarins (Hanover: Wesleyan University Press, 1990), esp. pp. 295-298.