Plant Minds: A Philosophical Defense

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Chauncey Maher, Plant Minds: A Philosophical Defense, Routledge, 2017, 131 pp., $70.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781138739192.

Reviewed by Colin Allen, University of Pittsburgh


What do you know about plants? You might not be surprised to hear that plants account for much more of the planet's biomass than animals -- hundreds of times more, in some estimates. You may, however, be surprised to learn that the number of plant species is relatively small compared to the number of animal species. It is an interesting question why plants have not diversified as much as animals have, but perhaps their immobility accounts for it. Nevertheless, with somewhere in the range of 300,000 to 400,000 species (estimates vary widely), there is plenty enough diversity among plants to yield some very interesting adaptations, from communication to carnivory.

The details of such adaptations are fascinating. Chauncey Maher's book provides a compact primer on the growing scientific appreciation for the range and sophistication of plant behavior. The complexities are such that a small minority of botanists have advocated oxymoronically for a subfield of "plant neurobiology." These advocates know, of course, that plants lack neurons. They are being deliberately provocative, intending to draw attention to parallels between plants and animals regarding their capacities to sense their environments, communicate with each other, and to respond to events in ways that entail some form of memory. Although the vast majority of botanists have roundly rejected the idea of plant neurobiology, the idea that plants are in some way "cognitive" has gained traction over the past decade.

This is intended to be a short book in a series aimed at a wide audience. The book includes 44 charming line drawings by Maher's colleague Jim Sias, a philosopher with artistic talent. Maher aims to convince his readers that the idea of plant minds is not silly, as he himself once thought. His enthusiasm for the marvels of plant physiology and the complexity of their responses to environmental stimuli is conveyed in a conversational tone. The prose becomes more didactic when discussing the issues in philosophy of mind and philosophy of cognitive science. The book seems most suited to the undergraduate classroom, where it could be read in a couple of weeks as a module in various philosophy courses, although only the eBook version is affordable for that purpose. Advanced undergraduates, postgraduates and professional philosophers could probably read it in an afternoon to satisfy their curiosity about the topic. Philosophers who work in the areas of mind and cognitive science are likely to find the coverage of the main theories in these fields too elementary to be informative.

Maher's first chapter ("Do plants have minds?") does not answer the question, but instead surveys seven historically important views about the nature of mind: Aristotelian, 17th- century mechanical philosophy, Cartesian dualist, Darwinian, behaviorist, neural identity, and computationalist. Maher concludes that only Cartesian dualism (probably) and identity theory (definitely) are incompatible with the possibility of plant minds. Deferring to computationalism as the dominant view within philosophy and cognitive science, Maher sets out to assess the actual case for plant minds in light of the criteria it provides, particularly computationalism's commitment to a representational theory of mind. The next four chapters, titled "Perceiving," "Feeling," "Remembering," and "Acting," run through a range of details about plants that are intended to move the reader towards the view that plants are not as simple or unintelligent as one might suppose. These chapters also continue to extend the discussion and evaluation of the philosophical theories outlined in the first chapter.

The chapter on perceiving contains an introduction to the anatomy and evolution of plants, and it surveys various ways in which plants respond to environmental stimuli. But is this perception? Maher admits that despite considerable sophistication in the ways that plants track light sources and respond to gravity, there is no evidence that plants represent these aspects of their environments. So, if representation is necessary for perception, they don't perceive, even if they can be said to sense and respond. Perhaps, though, it is not perception but feelings that are central to understanding whether plants have minds. This segues to the third chapter, which tackles the possibility of conscious feelings in plants. In this chapter comes a Trojan horse, which enters in the gloomy shadow of a discussion about qualia and the distraction of zombies. It arrives in the form of an eighth view about the nature of mind: enactivism. Broadly speaking, enactivism is the view that mind and phenomenology arise from the interactions between organisms and environments that are fundamental to the self-organized continuation of living things. On the enactivist view, no representations are necessary for mindedness.

Like any good story, however, the consequences of this plot twist are not made explicit until the final chapter. Before that are the fourth and fifth chapters, on remembering and acting. In these chapters, Maher continues to evaluate plant minds against the representationalist criteria favored within mainstream philosophy of mind. In the fourth chapter, he surveys philosophical accounts of information and function, and theories of representation and memory built upon them. He finds that even though these accounts suffice to support attribution of a weak form of information processing and memory to plants, the accounts themselves are too questionable philosophically to provide a strong basis for attributing memory to plants. In the fifth chapter, Maher shifts his attention to the distinction between voluntary and involuntary action, again assessing plants against a representationalist account of voluntary action, and once more finding that they fall short on that measure. According to Maher, "The big lesson of this chapter, is that the best case against plant minds . . . depends on the claim that minds require representations" (p.109).

This sets up the sixth and final chapter in which the forces of enactivism are fully unleashed. Here, Maher's attention shifts to facts such as the sheer volume of water that an oak or a magnolia must shift from its roots to its leaves on a daily basis -- a thing it must do just to stay alive. What has staying alive to do with being minded? (I apologize if you are now infected with a Bee Gees ear worm.) Maher's case for plant minds hinges, in the end, on the plausibility of the slogan borrowed from Evan Thompson that is also the chapter's title: "Mind in Life." As Maher recognizes, the view has implications that go well beyond plants; bacteria have minds too. But a central tension of the book is left unaddressed here, namely that if all that is needed is to establish plant minds is the fact that they are alive, then the specific details of the previous chapters don't really matter. This tension is reflected in the way Maher replies in the final chapter to five objections to enactivism. These objections concern the stretching of concepts, the deceptiveness of appearances, the failure to note distinctions, the dangers of romanticism, and the impracticality of treating all organisms as minded. None of these objections actually engages with the complex details of plant behavior. Nor do Maher's replies rely on those details.

The past several decades have seen a remarkable opening of attitudes among philosophers and scientists to mind and complex cognition in nonhuman animals. These changes have been driven by better experiments, closer observation of animals in a variety of settings, and deeper understanding of the neural mechanisms. There has been an interplay between the empirical work and conceptual work in areas such as animal communication and social cognition. The burden of Maher's argument for plant minds, however, seems nearly entirely conceptual. He writes on the final page: "Enactivism makes it plausible that plants and other organisms have minds." Perhaps the sophistication of plant behavior is intended as part of the case for enactivism, but Maher cannot go too far in that direction on pain of circularity.

Those who are drawn to enactivism are motivated by frustration with the paradigmatic problems of representationalism, including the difficulties of giving a fully satisfactory naturalistic account of meaning, values, and consciousness. They see these problems as vestiges of the Cartesian separation of mind and world, and they seek to bypass the problems by adopting a view in which meaning and phenomenology are immanent in the biological imperatives of organisms that must work continuously to remain alive. But the devil really is in the details, I believe. Maher complains that philosophy of mind and cognitive science have held as "thoughtless dogma . . . the idea that mind has nothing to do with life, as if it is just an inexplicable and uninteresting accident that only living things have minds" (p. 127). I am inclined to agree that cognitive science has paid insufficient attention to the fact that brains are built out of cells which are adaptive systems in their own right. But it is no less important to recognize that the fully conscious capacities of autobiographical memory, explicit decision making, painful experience, and so forth, depend on living cells being organized in specific ways. There is a reason that interfering with brains alters consciousness in obvious ways while removing a kidney does not, even though every kidney cell is as much a marvel of homeostatic self-organization as any brain cell. The functional architecture of nervous systems supports coordinated and unified action that integrates multiple information sources. This capacity allows animals to occupy niches that are out of reach for plants. Many of these niches require selective attention, high fidelity forms of perception, and detailed memories. Because of their relative immobility, the demands on plants are different. To catch a fly, the flowering part of a Venus flytrap does not require the immediate participation of its roots in the way that a flycatcher bird must coordinate wings, tail, torso, and head to get its meal. Neurons are the most energetically expensive cells and they have to earn their keep. Sea squirts are animals that absorb their own nervous systems once they make the shift from mobile larvae to a plant-like existence as sessile adults.

Maher does not deny that there are distinctions to be drawn among living things, but he does not allow that these distinctions amount to a division between mindedness and unmindedness. Resting this case on enactivism, he relies on an account that is itself too questionable philosophically to provide a strong basis for attributing minds to plants. Ultimately, I believe that it requires more than an appreciation for the marvelous intricacy of life to establish that plants have minds. It would require a theory of mentality that can account for the special contribution that neurons undoubtedly make to animal minds, along with a detailed demonstration that plants, by non-neural means, meet whatever structural or functional requirements arise from such an account.