Plant-Thinking: A Philosophy of Vegetal Life

Placeholder book cover

Michael Marder, Plant-Thinking: A Philosophy of Vegetal Life, Columbia University Press, 2013, 248pp., $30.00 (pbk), ISBN 9780231161251.

Reviewed by Jeffrey T. Nealon, Penn State University


In Gender Trouble (1990), Judith Butler pointed out that the era of identity politics was haunted by an "embarrassed etc." that inevitably attaches itself to any list of social recognition categories: race, class, gender, sexual orientation, disability, age, etc.[1] Wendy Brown's States of Injury (1995) offered the additional insight that subaltern status or "injury" had become the coin of the realm for recognition claims within identity politics. Following those powerful analyses, it was really only a matter of time before both the "etc." and the claims to "injury" decisively jumped the species line: why restrict the recognition of subaltern status to human lives? Cue, then, a robust emergent literature in Animal Studies.

If you have been paying attention to that recent flood of work in Animal Studies (and I guess even if you haven't), Michael Marder's book will strike you as the logical next step in the conversation about ethically compelling forms and modalities of life. Indeed, while animal life has been ignored or disrespected in most Western thinking, vegetal life has had an even rougher go of it. As Aquinas concisely sums up the philosophical prejudice, "Even brute animals are more noble than plants."[2]

And Marder does exceptional work in unearthing and meticulously documenting the "ethical neglect" (2) of vegetal life within the history of Western thought. Tracking down quotation after quotation where thinker after thinker excludes plants from consideration as ethically compelling forms of life (the sweep here is encyclopedic: Plato, Aristotle, Aquinas, Kant, Hegel, Nietzsche, Levinas, among many others), Marder makes a very strong case for philosophy's abjection of plant life (though one might wonder about some formulations, like "the violence that Aristotle's thought has unleashed against plants" [21] or "Husserl's failure to think the tree" [78]). However, the real upshot of the argument lies less in demonstrating this exclusion than in deconstructing it. In other words, Marder reads in this exclusion of plants a kind of recoil from the privileges of human thought and subjectivity, following the deconstructive sense that the privileged term in any opposition is consistently constructed and haunted by its abjected others.

This book owes its methodological allegiances squarely to contemporary continental philosophy -- Marder specifically credits "hermeneutic phenomenology, deconstruction, and weak thought" (5) -- and it's positively riddled with Heideggerianisms: "where the questioning impulse is dormant, ontological chimeras and ethical monstrosities rear their heads without delay" (2). In the main, he follows a kind of Heideggerian environmentalism insofar as it

resists the tyranny of 'objective' factuality and welcomes a multiplicity of interpretations, even as it takes the side of the victims of historical and metaphysical brutality . . . We must give prominence to plants, taking care to avoid their objective description, and thereby preserve their alterity. (7)

Though Marder goes a step further and promises a kind of Plant-Thinking that "accommodates plants' constitutive subjectivity, drastically different from that of human beings, and describes their world from the hermeneutical perspective of vegetal ontology (i.e., from the standpoint of the plant itself)" (9). In fact, Marder hopes to provide nothing less than a "vegetal existentiality, referring to the time, freedom and wisdom of plants" (90). This is a pretty tall order, it seems to me, though I suppose not wholly unlike much Animal Studies work in its attempts to go beyond documenting the abuses suffered by animals to consider, in a series of thought experiments, what it's like to be a bat or a farm animal.

So, what's it like to be a plant, "with its countless potentialities" (11)? Rather than dispute Western thinking's understanding of plant life, Marder doubles down on it: he shows quite persuasively that from Aristotle forward, plants represent the "lowest" form of life in Western thinking, with the subsequent tradition seldom straying far from Aristotle's picture of the "vegetable soul" as mere purposeless growth, without a higher or more noble end. But rather than see this growth without entelechy as plants' theoretical or material weakness, Marder re-thematizes the plant as ethically exemplary for our post-metaphysical era. For him, to be a plant is to grow endlessly outward toward the other, not to be self-concerned (or really to be a "self" at all), to generously and hospitably throw seed to the wind and fruit to the ground. In the end Marder argues, in classic deconstructive fashion, that this supposedly "lowest" manifestation of life (characterized by growth, emergence, excess, gift, otherness, thrownness) is in fact the condition of (im)possibility for the rational, privatizing, autonomous human subjectivity that takes itself to rule over the vegetative state. The vegetable psukhe of growth and emergence is a key, shared component of all "life."

This conclusion seems persuasive as far as it goes, and it's hard to disagree with sentiments like "the old question about the meaning of life should . . . give way to questions about the meanings of lives -- both human and non-human" (35). Indeed, Marder deserves much credit for forcefully inserting the question of vegetable life into the mix of contemporary ethical discourse in philosophy. He exhaustively and persuasively makes a sweeping negative case concerning Western thinking and its abjection of plant.

But the more "positive" account of vegetal life is, I think, where the book falters. This is primarily because Marder's plants teach us lessons that seem strangely familiar: "The positive dimension of plant-being, as the outcome of a critique of metaphysics, will spell out an inversion of traditional valuations, valorizing the other over the self, surface over depth, and so on" (11). Marder's version of Butler's "embarrassed etc." (his somewhat impatient "and so on") indicates a primary difficulty. Despite all his laudable attempts to honor the singularity of plant life (to give a phenomenological account of vegetal life's particular uniqueness), he ends up portraying plant life as virtually identical to a long line of deconstructive "others," entities or concepts that have likewise ushered in an "inversion of traditional valuations." As laudable as they are, sentiments like "Plant thinking starts with the explosion of identity" (43) depend very heavily on stock deconstructive chestnuts, the sort of stuff that has been offered as the ethical upshot of (among other formations) language, literature, painting, friendship, the feminine, the unconscious, death, desire, and animals.

Despite Marder's best efforts, plants begin to look like (merely?) another means to critique the "totalizing" dreams of metaphysics -- plants upset autonomous subjectivity, exemplify the time of Derridean différance, and threaten instrumental-rational progress with their own special brand of Hegelian bad infinity. Plants "tend to their other without limit, without term, and without ever reaching their final destination" (107). In their rhizomatic patterns of growth without entelechy, plants "welcome the other better" (42) than animals or humans; they exemplify the logic of the gift. Plants, like so many other deconstructive memes, are "resistant to idealization" (13).

Marder's signature methodological move (and its discontents) can perhaps be unpacked from this single sentence: "Plant thinking must perform a delicate balancing act of avoiding both crass empiricism and metaphysical excess -- but to do so, we ought to turn for guidance to the Derridean notion of iterability" (116). To paraphrase (and without wondering too much about the "must" and the "ought"), plants are singular, unique forms of life, strongly resistant to philosophical thematization. To demonstrate that, however, we turn to a familiar theme from recent continental thinking -- a concept that, on the face of it at least, has very little to do with plants or plant life (though a great deal to do with weak thought's well-known allergy toward "totalization").

So, in addition to the "vegetal différance" and "plants' proto-writing" (112) associated with Derrida, we're told that plant thinking "bears a close resemblance to the 'thousand plateaus'" (84) of Deleuze and Guattari. At the same time, plant thinking is "formally reminiscent of Heidegger's conclusions apropos of Dasein" (95), with "the vegetal mode of ec-static existence, past throwness, commencing with the literal throw of the seed, and future projection, bespeaking the plant's growth or non-conscious intentionality" (117): "To recap: vegetal indifference is ontological, though perhaps not ontic" (134). We're to understand "vegetal singularities, like the Spinozan potentia" (183) while simultaneously recalling that "vegetal existence belongs to the realm of the [Levinasian] 'otherwise than being'" (152). Not to mention that "the seed's singular plurality, on which Jean-Luc Nancy elaborates his own thinking of community, thus further specifies the sense of 'vegetal democracy'" (89).

In short, while it seems true enough (to recall the work of Butler and Brown with which we began) that "the post-metaphysical task of de-idealization finds an ally in the oppressed life of plants" (126), a rehearsal of those post-metaphysical tasks ends up devouring the specificity of plant life in Marder's work. Which is maybe forgivable in a work of philosophy, but his encyclopedic methodology tends to obscure a deeper, more sustained exploration of the unique roles of vegetable life within the recent continental philosophy that is his primary concern. For example Derrida's Glas, an incredibly complicated work deeply invested in the question of plant life, is treated by Marder in a paragraph here and there, as are Deleuze and Guattari's rhizomatics, as well Heidegger's strategic elision of "the plant-character of plant life" in his infamous 1929-30 seminars (where the stone is said to be worldless, the animal poor in world, and man world-building: what happened to the plant?).[3]

Given Marder's sense that "the emancipation of the flower will not come to pass without plant-thinking piercing through layer after layer of the idealist repression weighing upon it" (148), plant thinking here seems more concerned with combating a totalizing human form of "idealist repression" than anything else. Or at least the concerns of vegetal life "itself" come to look suspiciously like the concerns of the contemporary continental philosophy proseminar. Perhaps we would do well to recall, in this context, the words of well-known plant lovers Gene and Dean Ween: "Don't believe the florist when he tells you that the roses are free."[4]

But as I said, Marder is quite successful at making the case for the philosophical abjection of vegetal life in the West, so you would think that this extension of animal ethics discussions to plant life would be warmly welcomed within Animal Studies. And while I certainly hope that it will be, Marder's work has already raised eyebrows in that community. For example Gary Francione, the co-editor of Columbia's "Critical Perspectives on Animals" series (in which this book appears) is having none of it. In a pre-publication debate with Marder, Francione insists that "There is . . . not one shred of evidence about which I am aware that plants suffer or have any intentional states," so they have no "interests" and are not entitled to ethical recognition or any form of "subjectivity." Perhaps more contentiously, Francione adds:

I should note in the 30 years I have been doing this work [in Animal Studies], when I discuss this issue with people who are not vegans, the conversation almost invariably turns to a sudden solicitude for the 'interests' of the vegetables on our plates. We both know that the primary audience for your book will not be vegans who want to ponder whether they are under-inclusive ethically, but those who claim that we should skip over the interests of the cow and worry about whether the carrot had a tough harvesting season. If . . . this enterprise is really about putting cows and corn in the same group, then it would most certainly be an attempt to undermine veganism.[5]

Cary Wolfe's Before the Law ends with a similarly dismissive sense of skepticism about plants' claims to the hard-fought ethical gains of animal studies. He calls such sentiments a "cop out" and a "refusal to take seriously the differences between different forms of life -- sunflowers versus bonobos."[6] And I would note that both Francione and Wolfe are incredibly kind compared to the vitriolic fare to be found in the comment lines under the newspaper blog posts that Marder has authored on "plant intelligence."[7]

So it does seem that there is a contentious and presumably productive debate brewing here concerning plant and animal life, and a transversal discussion about ethics and vegetarianism. I should note in closing that, given the critiques Marder had to deal with before publication, he here has surprisingly little to say about the ethics of eating or otherwise killing the plant subjectivity that he's worked so hard to put on the ethical map -- other than to say that "plant-thinking does not oppose the use of fruit, roots, and leaves for human nourishment" (184) and his advising that we "eat like a plant!" (184). Which means what, you ask -- Dirt for lunch, again?

In answering, Marder returns once more to familiar nostrums from the seminar room:

Eating like a plant does not entail consuming only inorganic materials but welcoming the other, forming a rhizome with it, and turning oneself into the passage for the other without violating or dominating it, without endeavoring to swallow up its very otherness in one's corporeal and psychic interiority . . . We welcome the vegetal other when we avow its otherness, its irreducibility to a source of food or profit; we enter into a rhizomatic relation with it when we eat locally grown fruit and vegetables. (184-85)

I understand why many humans prefer buying green beans from the farmer's market to purchasing a can of wax beans from Wal-Mart, but I'm not sure why it makes any difference to the "vegetal other". Likewise, I can't see how the intentions or feelings of the human consumer (whether our "psychic interiority" trends toward totalizing or welcoming when we eat) can make much difference to the things that we're eating?

In the end, though, we owe Marder (along with a series of recent books in what we might call "critical plant studies," especially Matthew Hall's Plants as Persons and Richard Doyle's fine Darwin's Pharmacy) a great debt for widening the contemporary philosophical discussion of life and ethics, taking it into the plant kingdom. Who knows where these provocations will lead? It may be that in the future the salad bar will no longer offer an unproblematic ethical refuge from the rest of the menu at the steakhouse.

[1] See Butler's Gender Trouble (New York: Routledge, 1990), p. 143.

[2] See Summa Theologica, Third Part, Question 44, Article 4, Objection 1.

[3] See Heidegger's 1929-30 lecture course, World, Finitude, Solitude, translated by William McNeil and Nicholas Walker (Bloomington: Indiana University Press, 2001), pp. 177-79.

[4] From "Roses are Free" on Ween's 1994 album Chocolate and Cheese (Elektra).

[5] The debate can be found on the Columbia University Press blog,

[6] See Wolfe's Before the Law: Humans and Animals in a Biopolitical Frame (University of Chicago Press, 2012), p. 102.

[7] See the comments following Marder's two 2012 pieces for the New York Times philosophy blog, "If Peas Can Talk, Should We Eat Them? and the follow-up "Is Plant Liberation on the Menu?".