Plantinga's 'Warranted Christian Belief': Critical Essays with a Reply by Alvin Plantinga

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Dieter Schönecker (ed.), Plantinga's 'Warranted Christian Belief': Critical Essays with a Reply by Alvin Plantinga, De Gruyter, 2015, 270pp., $140.00 (hbk.), ISBN 9783110439137.

Reviewed by Kevin S. Diller, Taylor University


Walter de Gruyter has published in parallel two volumes devoted to Alvin Plantinga's Warranted Christian Belief (WCB). One is the first German translation of WCB and the other is this volume, a collection of nine critical essays and a reply by Plantinga. The collection emerged from a conference sponsored by the Fritz Thyssen Foundation and hosted at the Katholische Akademie Berlin in October of 2012 in which all of the authors participated. The principal champion of the project appears to be its editor, Dieter Schönecker, a Kant specialist at Universität Siegen.

The preface tells us that the motivation behind both the publishing of the translation and the essays is to give German audiences greater exposure to Plantinga's most influential work and to "boost the German reception of Plantinga's idea of what a warranted Christian belief could be" (viii). These essays are, however, far from a mere primer on WCB. They provide substantive critical engagement with Plantinga's work. Including Plantinga's invaluable reply, this volume will be enthusiastically received by those familiar with WCB.

In the opening essay Schönecker offers the only contribution which could be characterized as an introduction to WCB in that it is an attempt to come to grips with the fundamental argument and where WCB stands in the trajectory of Plantinga's development of Reformed Epistemology. Schönecker impressively tracks the complex pre-history of WCB, its variegated arguments and diverse reception. He argues that the reception of WCB has been confused by its being the third and culminating book to two different trilogies (13). While it is clearly the last of Plantinga's volumes on the nature of warrant, Plantinga himself acknowledges that WCB is a sequel to the early texts in Reformed Epistemology: God and Other Minds and "Reason and Belief in God". On Schönecker's analysis of WCB’s reception the confusion lies in not fully appreciating and distinguishing the multiple claims Plantinga defends.

Schönecker notes that many interpreters have misunderstood Plantinga's aim to be defending the truth or warrant of Christian belief (18). After all, in his earlier work he defended the proper basicality of belief in God by means of a parity argument (belief in God is like belief in other minds or memory beliefs). These interpreters are often disappointed to find that WCB does not advance this kind of argument to show that Christian belief has warrant and is true. Instead they find only the underwhelming assertion that Christian belief probably has warrant if it turns out that it is true. Plantinga acknowledges that Schönecker is correct, but claims that there is much more, and much more of value, to his argument than this (237). Schönecker gives his readers a perceptively detailed treatment of many of Plantinga's argument threads. Between Schönecker's essay and Plantinga's reply the reader is given a very helpful guide to reading WCB. Plantinga clarifies that what some have taken as the strong parity arguments for proper basicality were merely arguments that one may believe God exists without failing to fulfill one's epistemic duties. What the warrant trilogy shows is that there is much more going on in arriving at a belief that constitutes knowledge. WCB is a massive advance not only in its treatment of theologically-rich Christian belief but also in its analysis of what it is to know Christian belief to be true.

This essay also presents a number of critiques of Plantinga's argument. These critiques will not convince all readers and clearly did not convince Plantinga himself, though of course he engages them with humor and modesty. Schönecker is decidedly dismissive of the importance of Plantinga's argument that there is no viable de jure objection to Christian belief (24-30, 36). He seems to think that most who object to Christian belief are not objecting to how the belief is formed, and yet some of the most well-known objectors of the last decade (e.g. Daniel Dennett, Christopher Hitchens, etc.) advance a de jure objection as their primary critique. Schönecker also has relatively little to say about the significance of the heart of WCB, part III, where Plantinga develops his extended A/C Model. The value of this section he reduces to the claim that warranted Christian belief is epistemically possible (23-24). But this misses just how helpful it is to see -- in light of Plantinga's analysis of knowledge in general -- how a robust Christian faith arises and can be in all ways epistemically righteous.

Schönecker concludes with his own suggestion for how to conceive of Plantinga's "most important argument" (37). What Schönecker finds most valuable are the pieces of Plantinga's work that can be put together, not just to defend Christian belief from objections or provide a model for how it may have warrant, but to argue that Christian belief indeed does have warrant (24, 37-38). He offers an interesting suggestion: that we consider Plantinga's 2011, Where the Conflict Really Lies, as a concluding part of the WCB argument. Schönecker says that given Plantinga's analysis of knowledge only theism and naturalism could have warrant and yet Plantinga shows that naturalism is self-defeating, so only theism could have warrant. He also brings back a parity argument and concludes that "if anything is warranted, then Christian belief is warranted" (38). It strikes one that this is just a sketch of what Schönecker might develop into a full-fledged argument for the warrant of Christian belief. It is, however, a regrettable strategy because it is at odds with the main thrust and contribution of WCB. Plantinga shows us how the resources of the Christian faith point to and describe the work of God in human knowers. He shows how this fully satisfies the conditions for warrant without providing an external human argument or strategy to replace God's work in human knowers as the one secure ground of the warrant for Christian belief.

"Reference to an Infinite Being" by Christian Tapp engages with the critiques of Kant, Gordon Kaufman and Hick that ask whether one can even raise the question of Christian belief. Plantinga argues that there is nothing in the work of these noted figures which leads to the reasonable conclusion that we cannot think about or refer to God. Tapp agrees with Plantinga but also offers what he says is a more charitable reading of Kant, a more constructive reading of Kaufman, and a stronger reading of Hick. He then attempts to reconstruct Plantinga's thoughts on reference and his notion of divine infinity, especially in relation to the critiques of Kaufman and Hick.

In Plantinga's illuminating response, he seems to approve Tapp's conclusions about infinity and reference to God, though he does not give us any detailed discussion. He is not as sanguine about the value of Tapp's alternative readings of Kant and Kaufman. It is worth noting that what is important to Plantinga's argument is not to defend an interpretation of these figures but rather to undermine what others have taken as an argument from their work against reference to God. It seems, therefore, that Plantinga would happily embrace an alternative reading of Kant or Kaufman that better coheres with Christian belief. However, Plantinga does not find Tapp's more charitable reading of Kant to be a sensible reading, and he does not find Tapp's more constructive reading of Kaufman to serve clarity in constructive dialog. This last point of exchange offers readers a subtle but very significant discussion that will be of particular interest to those concerned with the apologetic value of reinterpretations of Christian belief.

In the next essay readers are treated again to an enlightening exchange. "An Underrated Merit of Plantinga's Philosophy" by Winfried Löffler focuses on the significance of what he calls 'world-view beliefs' in Plantinga's early work and worries that it has lost the attention it deserves in his later work. (For some American readers at least, discussions of 'world-view' brings connotations that must be kept in check to grasp Löffler's insights.) Löffler tries to clarify what he means by 'world-view/Weltanschauung' with rough synonyms like: 'implicit metaphysics,' 'conceptual frameworks,' and 'hinge propositions'. Key Plantingean examples include belief in a personal God, belief in other minds and belief that there is a past. Löffler notes that these beliefs provide "the necessary context and background in light of which we understand our world" (77). His critique of Plantinga is that these highly epistemologically influential beliefs don't fit into Plantinga's categorization of propositional beliefs as either basic or inferential beliefs  Löffler offers a 'refined model of noetic structures' with a seven-fold categorization of beliefs moving from more particular to more general beliefs.

Plantinga’s reply is rather affirming of Löffler's thoughts. The only correction he gives is to clarify that he does consider non-inferential 'world-view' beliefs to be basic along with all other non-inferential beliefs. He spends most of his response pondering the relationship between more general beliefs (e.g. there has been a past) and more particular beliefs (e.g. this morning I rode my bike). Though neither Plantinga nor Löffler place their discussion in the broader critiques of analytic epistemology, it is clear that this essay acknowledges what is often left underdeveloped in approaches to epistemology that tend to focus on discrete propositions and neglect the diachronic aspects of human knowing.

Oliver Wiertz addresses the question, "Is Plantinga's A/C Model an Example of Ideologically Tainted Philosophy?" He notes (and those of us who have taught this material will concur) that there is a common reaction to Plantinga's work in epistemology -- a worry that Plantinga's argument is motivated in some untoward way by his Christian commitments. Wiertz analyzes this reaction and tries to identify what lines of Plantinga's argument might be taken as tainted by something other than "providing neutral, rational philosophical analysis and argumentation" (84-85). He comes up with three possibilities and concludes that there is no compelling case against Plantinga. Plantinga in reply expresses his appreciation for Wiertz's defense and takes the opportunity to consider what might be at the root of the objection and again clarify his project.

While Wiertz appreciates and defends Plantinga's work, he also maintains that Plantinga could have shielded himself from suspicion with a healthy dose of natural theology (99, 111). Wiertz seems to think that in Plantinga's response to Great Pumpkin objections and treatment of defeaters he could avoid being misunderstood by providing reasons to commend theism that all parties would accept. In so doing Wiertz perpetuates rather than combats a common misunderstanding of WCB. Plantinga is characteristically patient and lucid in his replies.

Thomas Schärtl ("Moderating Certainty") critiques Plantinga's notion of faith as knowledge and opts for a Kantian and Wittgensteinian alternative that he calls "living by a concept" (136). Schärtl seems to miss altogether the point and significance of Plantinga's arguments in WCB and therefore often adopts a hastily dismissive tone. It is ironic that in an essay arguing for moderation in our epistemic claims that Schärtl comes across so certain of his scathing critiques. The most Plantinga can say for the essay is that it is "intriguing" (249) and "stimulating" (252), and that he agrees with some of the comments Schärtl makes.

The failure of the exchange between Schärtl and Plantinga may serve to remind Christian philosophers of just how much patient work needs to be done to converse across deep divides between epistemological traditions. There is no question that Schärtl has important epistemological insights to bring from Bernard Lonergan, Wittgenstein and Rush Rhees that would help to give a more holistic picture of human knowing. What neither party seems to be able to work toward are the ways in which Plantinga's model for warrant might complement or be complemented by Schärtl's insights. Schärtl advances on Plantinga's arguments with numerous mistaken assumptions, and Plantinga focuses on responding to these in his reply. As with Wiertz, Plantinga is forced to retrace once more the fundamentals of his work and in this case even basic points from "Advice to Christian Philosophers" about what kinds of projects are worth pursuing and which kind is found in WCB.

Anita Renusch poses questions for Plantinga that arise within contexts of religious diversity. She argues that the reality of religious diversity makes it much more difficult than Plantinga acknowledges to maintain that one is in a better epistemic position than others. Renusch gives a helpful canvassing of positions on epistemic disagreement and peerhood. Disagreements of belief between epistemic agents who are in equivalent epistemic positions vis-à-vis the formation of their disagreeing beliefs may result in a defeater for the beliefs of both epistemic agents. Renusch argues that this is commonly the case for Christian believers, who encounter epistemic agents with whom they disagree about Christian belief and whom they have reason to judge as epistemic peers.

In reply to Renusch, Plantinga says more to clarify his views on epistemic peerhood than one finds in his other writings. Many readers will enjoy the autobiographical elements as Plantinga illustrates his points by reference to his epistemic situation within a context of disagreement in the philosophy department at Wayne State University. Plantinga grants many of Renusch's points which do not in fact challenge the claims of WCB. He clarifies that epistemic peerhood must always be judged with respect to domains relevant to the particular belief in question. He defends the possibility -- though certainly not the guarantee -- that some Christian believers may rightly consider themselves to be justified, rational and warranted in holding that they are in a better epistemic position with respect to the formation of Christian belief than those with whom they disagree.

We enjoy a refreshing change of pace with theologian Georg Plasger's "Does Calvin teach a sensus divinitatis? Reflections on Alvin Plantinga's Interpretation of Calvin". Plasger is interested in examining how well Calvin's theology of revelation actually fits with Plantinga's A/C Model. He concludes that Plantinga has fundamentally misunderstood Calvin's view of the role of the sensus divinitatis in coming to a knowledge of God. Plasger argues that for Calvin knowledge of God by faith does not come from a reviving of the sensus divinitatis. "The knowledge of God as the creator is not a continuation or an enhancement of the sensus divinitatis; rather it is an entirely new knowledge of the triune God" (185). Plasger stresses that for German reformed theologians following Calvin, "there can be no question of a complementary relationship between the natural knowledge of God and one that is imparted by the Holy Spirit" (188).

Plantinga finds Plasger's paper impressive, and is willing mostly to defer to Plasger's expertise on Calvin. He clears up several places where he believes that Plasger has misunderstood what he claims of Calvin. He stresses, as he did in WCB, that his primary claim and interest is not to defend a particular interpretation of Calvin but to appeal to Calvin as "a source of some general ideas" developed in his own way (255). He also reminds readers that a revived sensus divinitatis was never proposed as the source of the deliverances of faith that produce Christian belief according to his A/C Model. Reception of the knowledge of God revealed in Christ -- as Plasger and almost any theology of Christian revelation would affirm -- is a work of God the Spirit.

In "Is Suffering the Rock of Atheism?" Christian Illies is principally concerned to analyze Plantinga's argument in chapter 14 of WCB that awareness of evil does not provide a defeater for theistic and Christian belief. While Illies does not engage with Plantinga's broader corpus on the problem of evil and very little of the broader philosophical literature it has ignited, he nevertheless produces a trenchant analysis of the argument. Illies agrees with Plantinga that evil and suffering provide no successful de facto objection to the truth of theism, but he argues that in WCB Plantinga underestimates the rational force of the problem of evil to provide warrant for atheism. His primary complaint seems to be that Plantinga's arguments will not be convincing to those who do not already believe in God. "Plantinga gives the person on the fence no strong reason to jump to the right side" (207).

It might seem that this critique is misplaced, criticizing Plantinga for not achieving what he never set out to achieve in the first place, namely, to provide in his response to the problem of evil good reasons for atheists to believe that God exists. And indeed in Plantinga's reply to Illies, as in his response to several of the other essays, he rehearses again the intentions of WCB. He also takes the opportunity to bring into the discussion some of the development of his work on the problem of evil that began in WCB and was taken up further in his "Supralapsarianism, or 'O Felix Culpa'". He argues that though the world contains evil we can see this is a very good world because of just what that evil occasioned -- the towering display of divine love found in the atonement and incarnation. Plantinga does not suggest that this will demonstrate the truth of theism to the atheist but he is much more optimistic than Illies that his arguments may address some of the issues plaguing those who are on the fence.

Finally, mathematician Gregor Nickel discusses methodological questions with reference to Plantinga's use of certain kinds of probabilistic reasoning in the warrant trilogy. He first raises issues for the positive use of probabilistic reasoning and then essentially affirms Plantinga's position in the debate among Plantinga, Swinburne and McGrew on dwindling probabilities. Nickel's worries for Plantinga seem primarily built around a rejection of the utility or possibility of 'absolute' probability. He suggests that the only kind of probability a mathematician is permitted is probability given assumed conditions. "Mathematical knowledge… is always dependent on assumptions, on a priorly fixed framework" (213). He offers concerned 'notes in the margins' that suggest that Plantinga may improperly appeal to 'absolute' probability.

The thrust of Nickel's essay seems to be to show how difficult if not impossible it is to assign mathematical probabilities to phenomena in the fields of philosophy and theology and to discourage attempts by philosophers of religion to develop arguments that appeal to them. If so, he is preaching to the choir. The essay does prompt Plantinga to clarify his use of and distinction between statistical and epistemic probabilities. He clarifies and defends the coherence of his own notion of 'absolute' probability and yet agrees with what he takes to be Nickel's primary concern -- that we are not in a position to give a reasonable assignment of such probabilities. This, however, does not impact Plantinga's arguments or his model for how it is that our beliefs might have warrant. Epistemic probability for Plantinga depends on the warrant for a belief. Nickel notes with concern that Plantinga's view of warrant depends on probability. But, the only dependence here is on the favorable statistical probability that noetic facilities are aimed at truth. There would only be a concern if Plantinga attempted to defend by probabilistic reasoning that our beliefs actually have warrant. But of course Plantinga makes no such attempt by any reasoning probabilistic or otherwise. At the end of the day, Nickel's chief concerns with Plantinga may boil down to the same mistaken assumption that so many have incautiously read into WCB.

There is no question that Schönecker has assembled a strong collection of penetrating essays from contemporary German scholars that engage substantively with one of the most important works in Christian analytic epistemology. The greatest disappointment with the collection is how often the apologetic value of WCB is either misunderstood or underappreciated. One often senses the hope that philosophy would answer the epistemological question of Christian belief without theological assistance, and that Plantinga has attempted to do so. This may somewhat mute the volume’s effectiveness in introducing Plantinga's thought to new readers. On the other hand, it occasions many opportunities for Plantinga to clarify and further elucidate his work. No doubt many readers will find that, in addition to the nine sturdy essays, Plantinga's detailed responses provide the dessert nonpareil. One certainly hopes that along with the German translation of WCB the discussions begun in this volume will continue constructively for new and old audiences alike.