Plasticity at the Dusk of Writing: Dialectic, Destruction, Deconstruction

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Catherine Malabou, Plasticity at the Dusk of Writing: Dialectic, Destruction, Deconstruction, Carolyn Shread (tr.), Columbia UP, 2010, 96 pp., $40.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780231145244.

Reviewed by John Protevi, Louisiana State University



This translation of a 2005 French text will be of great interest to readers of Hegel, Heidegger and Derrida. Catherine Malabou is the author of a number of major works treating this trio, which may come to replace the vaunted “Three H’s” (Hegel, Husserl, Heidegger) with their own grouping, “HHD,” as it were. If you are in search of a quick label, you could say Malabou presents a “post-deconstructive” reading, but as with all such labels, that would do scant justice to the richness of her work.

The book has the form of an intellectual autobiography, though it is not really about Malabou the person, but about the concepts of our era, or more strikingly still, about the “materiality of existence and [the transformations of] its ontological meaning” (81). Malabou uses the figure of the “transformative mask,” drawn from Lévi-Strauss, to discuss the relations among the figures and concepts she studies, those that inform our ontology as expressed by HHD (4). A transformative mask is split along the vertical axis, allowing the two halves to fold in to meet along the dividing line, and to fold out to reveal another mask — which can itself be similarly split and concealing — underneath. The first masks combine HHD with Freud and Lévi-Strauss in various conjunctions, and the final confrontation is between philosophy and the neurosciences (4). With this relation of philosophy and one of its others, Malabou argues that “plasticity” has come to replace “writing” as the “motor scheme” of our epoch (13, 31, 57). We will return to this claim at the conclusion of the review.

Malabou begins by opposing two notions of negation, a dialectical one in which presence is re-formed after a temporal sojourn, and a deconstructive one in which resolution is endlessly deferred in the “spacing of a pure dislocation” (5). This opposition is not fixed but subject to a continuous circulation of mutual transformation. So then a further question must be posed: is the “space of confrontation” between the two forms of negation (dialectical and deconstructive) itself dialectical or merely a juxtaposition? That is, is the relation of temporal resolution and spatial dislocation temporal or spatial? Does it head toward re-formation of presence or are form and presence threatened with “explosion”? (6) A further twist, however: the second option, irresolvable conflict and exploded form, can itself be seen as both temporal differentiation (the final re-formation is endlessly deferred) and as the pure synchronicity of difference (at any one time, at all times, the elements of thought and being are separated). I will not continue, but Malabou is able to produce a few more embeddings along these lines; these are beautiful passages — as is the entire work — demonstrating her complete mastery of dialectic and deconstruction, making them both object and method of themselves and each other.

Malabou’s key concept is “plasticity,” which she first finds as a desideratum of the “philosophical exposition” that constitutes Hegel’s Phenomenology (8-9). As she notes, the Greek plassein means to take or receive form and to mold or give form, while our modern term “plastic explosive” points us to the potential to destroy or explode form (87, note 13). But the potential for using Hegelian plasticity against or in addition to Heideggerian destruction and Derridean deconstruction seemed to her at first to suffer from an irremediable delay, both spatial and temporal. Following a Heideggerian analysis, plasticity seems too metaphysical, deriving from a notion of plastic space that is all too corporeal and unable to attain the “pure, ontological space” of clearing (10). On the other hand, following a Derridean analysis, plasticity, like all concepts, is self-deconstructively riven from within; it thus suffers a temporal delay “in relation to itself, an irremediable discrepancy between its metaphysical vigor and the ruins produced by its own deconstruction” (11). Again, we cannot follow the details of Malabou’s argument, but overall it serves to introduce the confrontation of plasticity and deconstructive trace or writing. This impossible but necessary confrontation, expressed in terms of mourning and melancholia, serves as the pivot of the remainder of the book, in which Malabou recounts how she came to see the replacement of writing by plasticity as the motor scheme of our epoch (11-12).

A motor scheme is not a Zeitgeist (57), but “a pure image of a thought” which is “a type of tool capable of gathering the greatest quantity of energy and information in the text of an epoch” (14). Finding the motor scheme of an epoch is no mere hermeneutical ploy, but a necessity of thought: “to think is always to schematize, to go from the concept to existence by bringing a transformed concept into existence” (13). The motor scheme of an epoch "gathers and develops the meanings and tendencies that impregnate the culture at a given moment as floating images, which constitute, both vaguely and definitely, a material ‘atmosphere’ or Stimmung (‘humor,’ ‘affective tonality’)" (14; emphases in original). Malabou first locates plasticity as the motor scheme for Hegel, while it is time (later specified as “change” 31) for Heidegger, and writing for Derrida that serve in that capacity. But the replacement of one motor scheme by another is not a simple dialectical sublation, for “dusk” as the moment of replacement also means insomnia and melancholia, the inability to mourn and move on (15). So while the formal undecidability of “plasticity at the dusk of writing” — between a completed mourning allowing replacement and a fixed, immobile melancholia — will always haunt her, Malabou does hold out the “belief” that it is possible to accede to "another dusk, or at least another meaning of dusk," that is, metamorphosis (17; emphases in original).

By a complex reading of the Hegel / Heidegger relation, Malabou is then able to show the self-transformation of plasticity and metamorphosis. Plasticity is the necessary motor scheme for reading HHD, since a simple focus on negativity in its three guises of dialectic, destruction and deconstruction “cannot be taken as objects without being immediately frozen or cut off from their power of metamorphosis” (21). Plasticity fits the bill, since it is itself a plastic notion, that is, it maps form and content, it does what it says; thus Malabou sets out to "test the plasticity of the concept of plasticity … examining its metabolic power, its capacity to order transformation" (21; emphases in original). But even as it forms the motor scheme of the current epoch, plasticity “itself” is not the object of Malabou’s thought; the true object of her thought is rather the "metamorphic structure that authorizes the shift from one era of thought and history to another" (27; emphases in original). So plasticity actually refers to what Malabou calls in a striking phrase, "the metabolism of philosophy, the exchanges arranged between its inside and outside, itself and its other" (27; emphases in original). In this way, plasticity goes underground in Heidegger as it were, appearing as metamorphosis, the economy of change Malabou articulates in Le Change Heidegger (Scheer, 2004).

In her reading of Heidegger, Malabou introduces an important concept: ontological economy or "absolute ontological mutability" (44; emphases in original). A vast research project opens up with her claim that "in Heidegger’s philosophy metaphysics and capitalism coincide" (44; emphases in original). Thus her own position, what she elsewhere calls a “new materialism” (61; 77), is to "affirm the mutual convertibility of trace and form in an attempt to put an end to the dematerialization and demonetarization of contemporary philosophy" (45). These are fascinating suggestions, and a confrontation of her work here and that of Philip Goodchild in his recent Theology of Money (Duke, 2009) would be very promising.

Malabou also pursues the way in which Levinas and Derrida oppose trace to form, privileging the former, while her own position insists on the irreducibility of form we find in plasticity. In this way, she can propose plasticity or metamorphosis as providing a concept of alterity without transcendence. Insofar as deconstruction aims at revealing the trace, Malabou must propose another reading method, which she names “plastic reading,” which “aspires to the metamorphosis of deconstructive reading,” that is, it “seeks to reveal the form [rather than the trace] left in the text through the withdrawing of presence, that is, through its own deconstruction” (52). As with all Malabou’s analyses, a mere summary in a book review format can only state the results or theses, whereas the true philosophical reward lies in following the admirably intricate argumentation.

With these limits in mind, let us conclude the review by looking to her thought of plasticity as a motor scheme, whereby it is “becoming both the dominant formal motif of interpretation and the most productive exegetical and heuristic tool of our time” (57). In this “new configuration” we find "new metamorphic occurrences are appearing at the level of social and economic organization and at the level of ‘gender’ or individual sexual identity" (57; emphases in original). Plasticity as our motor scheme succeeds writing, which was “the result of a gradual movement that began with structuralism and found its mooring in linguistics, genetics, and cybernetics” (57). In support of her claim about the epoch of writing, she cites the important and widely-noted work of François Jacob, La logique du vivant (Gallimard, 1970; translated as The Logic of Life [Princeton, 1973]) and says of it: “DNA is the biological translation of a general ontology of the graph” (58). Derrida’s Of Grammatology is of course the fullest expression of this “graph ontology,” of writing as motor scheme (58-59).

But now the motor scheme is plasticity. The bulk of the book is Malabou’s argument that plasticity enables us to read the metamorphic structure enabling the interrelations of HHD to be a series of transformational masks. The last mask, however, as we recall, was that between philosophy and neuroscience. Referring to her Que faire de notre cerveau? (Bayard, 2004; translated as What Should We Do with Our Brain? [Fordham, 2008]), Malabou briefly discusses neuronal plasticity, as described by Jean-Pierre Changeux, L’homme neuronal (Fayard, 1983; translated as Neuronal Man [Pantheon, 1985]). Although neuronal plasticity is described in terms of a graph of shaping / receiving / exploding form, this is “not a graphic metaphor”; instead we have “the geographical or political metaphor of assemblies, forms, or neuronal populations” (60). The key point is that neuronal plasticity is possible only with genetic indetermination: “plasticity forms where DNA no longer writes” (60).

This point may need some slight nuancing if it is to be brought to bear on Mary Jane West-Eberhard’s work in Developmental Plasticity and Evolution (Oxford, 2003), where developmental plasticity works with unexpressed genetic variation, that is, DNA whose writing has not yet found its functional expression. Despite this quibble, we can accept that various notions of plasticity are indeed in heavy use in the biological sciences today, and this lends weight to Malabou’s claim that we have a “new materialism” at the “dusk of writing,” and thus that plasticity is the “metamorphosis of writing” (61). But again, we must return to the duplicity of dusk, for plasticity does not cleanly and simply replace writing. Although it is caught, fixed, between mourning and melancholia, plasticity is also transformative, mobile, leaning toward “a dusk that is the dusk of farewell” that is, a dusk that is a “reprieve, or at least toward a degree of success in mourning” (62).

Two sets of questions can be posed to conclude the review. (1) What of Deleuze and “a new materialism”? What would happen if we engage philosophers other than HHD? Would plasticity still hold as the motor scheme for Deleuze? This is not to complain that Malabou hasn’t written an encyclopedia of contemporary philosophy; it is to indicate that on the basis of her proposal there are wonderful books to be written here, excellent new readings to be produced. (2) Are there other motor schemes at work in our epoch? What about natural selection as a “universal acid” as Daniel Dennett puts it in Darwin’s Dangerous Idea (Simon & Schuster, 1995)? Do not we see scholars proposing “design spaces” and “selection pressures” for just about everything? What about its intersection, via the notions of competition and scarcity, with economics? Markets and entrepreneurship, investment and return: are they not powerful motor schemes for our epoch? And to return to Deleuze and a new materialism, what about dynamic systems theory, all the uses of “phases space” and “attractors”? Even in brain studies, the basic notion of plasticity is complemented by neurodynamics, which operates by dynamic systems modeling. Synaptic formation/destruction and “resonant cell assemblies” (a favorite concept of Francisco Varela): are they not equally basic concepts in contemporary neuroscience?

I do not pretend to have answers to these questions, nor am I even sure they are well-formulated questions. But it is clearly to the credit of Catherine Malabou that her excellent work provokes these or perhaps even better formulated questions, in addition to providing us with an exhilarating tour of a masterful reader, writer, and thinker of the hugely important tradition gathered under the names Hegel, Heidegger, and Derrida.