Plato and Aristotle in Agreement? Platonists on Aristotle From Antiochus to Porphyry

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George E. Karamanolis, Plato and Aristotle in Agreement? Platonists on Aristotle From Antiochus to Porphyry, Oxford University Press, 2006, 432pp., $90.00 (Cloth), ISBN 0199264562.

Reviewed by Lloyd P. Gerson, University of Toronto


The author of this revised 2001 D.Phil. Oxford thesis never does get around to offering a direct answer to the question posed in the title of his book. He does, however, scrupulously sift through the generally scant evidence regarding the views of a number of Platonists on this matter. He concludes that their tendency to view Aristotle as a Platonist in some sense was not ill-founded; on the contrary, those who take the "harmonists" to be benighted or philosophically naïve have the weaker case.

Last year, I published a book with a similar theme, Aristotle and Other Platonists (Cornell University Press, 2005). The authors I considered were mainly those called "Neoplatonists." I, too, argued that the case for harmony was better than most scholars in the 20th century have supposed. Most of the authors considered by Karamanolis are so-called Middle Platonists, though his last three chapters are devoted to Ammonius Saccas (the teacher of Plotinus), Plotinus himself, and his pupil, Porphyry. So, our books do overlap to a certain extent in the material treated. I devoted little attention to the question of how the agreement of Aristotle and Plato was considered in the Middle Platonists because of the paucity of textual evidence. Karamanolis's conclusion is that Antiochus of Ascalon (c. 130 -- c. 68 B.C.E.), Plutarch of Chaeronea (c. 45 -- 125 C.E.), Ammonius Saccas (3rd cent. C.E.), and Porphyry (234 -- c. 305 C.E.) were definitely harmonists; Numenius (2nd cent. C.E.), Atticus (2nd cent. C.E.), and Plotinus (204/5 -- 270 C.E.) were not, although as Platonists they (with the exception of Atticus) evidently found the study of Aristotle's philosophy valuable for understanding Platonism. It must be emphasized, however, that apart from Plutarch and Plotinus, the extant evidence regarding these philosophers' views on harmony is distressingly meager. As the author concedes, in the cases of Numenius and Ammonius, we know almost nothing; for Antiochus, we are better served, though almost entirely by the unsystematic testimony of Cicero; as for Porphyry, we know little more than that he wrote an entire book (or two) on the subject, alas, not extant. When Karamanolis is forced to move from reasonable reconstruction to speculation, he is pretty clearly on the side (my side) of those who disagree with Richard Sorabji's often reprinted remark that the idea of the harmony of Aristotle and Plato was a "perfectly crazy proposition." He does not mention or apparently use my book. I welcome it, therefore, as independent confirmation of the position for which I argued. Our two books taken together do, I believe, provide ample evidence for the claim that harmony was the default position throughout antiquity and not just among the Neoplatonists. Indeed, as Karamanolis shows (pp.36-43; 331-6), this was the standard position of Peripatetics, too. His book, however, owing to the nature of the material with which is he dealing, is not able to address very forcefully the philosophical doubts behind Sorabji's complaint.

The Platonism with which Aristotle was supposedly in agreement must of course be understood as a construction out of the dialogues. Later Platonists, beginning with Plotinus, also paid considerable attention to Aristotle's testimony. Karamanolis argues that the dialogues "resist" systematization (p.11), which leaves him insisting, somewhat weakly, that those Middle Platonists who favored harmony held that Aristotle was a part of the "Platonic tradition" (p.126). Alternatively, he is left to argue that one or another Platonist found an ethical or psychological view of Aristotle to be more or less in line with Plato's teaching on the same subject. The phrase "Platonic tradition" is evidently intended not to be equivalent to a systematic philosophical position. I suppose that thus qualified, the claim that Aristotle belongs to this tradition is not particularly contentious. Nor is the claim that, for example, in a broad sense Aristotle shared with Plato a view on the nature of the good life. By contrast, later Platonists sought to understand how particular claims made in the dialogues were supposed to fit together (for example, the separation of Forms and the superordinate Idea of the Good, cause of the being of the Forms) and how these claims cohered with Aristotle's testimony (for example, that Plato identified the Idea of the Good with "the One"). It was the philosophy they thus constructed -- and that we call "Platonism" -- that they, remarkably, held Aristotle to be in substantial agreement with despite his obvious objections. In this regard, it is not even of central importance whether Aristotle himself thought he was in agreement with Plato or not. What matters above all is whether or not the philosophical principles to which Aristotle adheres are Plato's or not. If they were, then though Aristotle sometimes goes wrong in applying those principles, he is a Platonist nonetheless. It is also worth noting that the later Platonic position is the opposite of Karamanolis's: they held that Plato had a systematic philosophy, albeit imperfectly represented in the dialogues. By contrast, Aristotle had no systematic philosophy of his own (something that many scholars have recognized), because the systematic philosophical position to which he subscribed was Platonism.

Antiochus is in a way the most important of the Middle Platonic harmonists. He was probably the first to represent Plato's philosophy in a systematic manner in the light of Academic, Peripatetic, and Stoic debates in the intervening centuries. His rejection of the skeptical or non-dogmatic version of Platonism held by his teacher Philo of Larissa was followed by an attempt to grasp the philosophical position to which both Aristotle and Stoics were thought in some sense to adhere. As Karamanolis argues, the systematic core of Plato's philosophy in the view of Antiochus was ethics (p.59). Accordingly, the primary focus of epistemology is on ethical knowledge. Thus, Aristotle's rejection of separate Forms is relatively insignificant compared with his agreement with Plato that such knowledge was possible and, indeed, that this knowledge depended on the existence of stable and knowable essences in nature. From this perspective, Stoic epistemology and its basic ethical orientation can be seen as Platonic, even if its insistence on the sufficiency of virtue for happiness cannot (pp.64-71). Karamanolis rightly concludes that Antiochus' position is unfairly regarded as syncretist or eclectic (p.81); rather, he stands out as a defender of a sophisticated version of Platonism who was also perhaps the first to engage constructively with the major philosophical responses to Plato.

In his chapter on Plutarch, the author examines a version of Platonism and Aristotle's fidelity to it that insists on the opposition of Stoicism to Platonism. This is Platonism where the primary focus is on metaphysics and hence where Plato's Pythagoreanism can be emphasized (p.87). Along the materialism vs. immaterialism divide, Aristotle will side with Plato and Stoics will side with Epicureans. Acknowledging Aristotle's rejection of separate Forms, Plutarch nevertheless maintains that Aristotle's understanding that cognition is of form makes his position harmonious with Plato's (p.114). Thus, the separation of Forms is no longer the watershed. It is this strategy of denying that separation is the crucial issue that will guide later harmonists. Look rather, they argued, at what explanatory role the Forms are intended to serve and see whether or not Aristotle agrees that that role must be fulfilled. If he does, then his Platonism is not essentially compromised by his disagreement on separation. Indeed, later Platonists started out with the assumption that Forms are not separate from the Good or from the Demiurge or from each other; in that case, what Aristotle rejected is for the most part not what Plato himself embraced.

The chapters on Numenius and Atticus yield less interesting results because, as Karamanolis concedes, "we actually know next to nothing about Numenius' attitude to Aristotle, not even if he had one (p.148)." As for Atticus, it seems, judging from the fragments of his book preserved in Eusebius' Preparatio Evangelica, that he was militantly anti-Peripatetic. But this work was a polemical tract, possibly originating from the first holder of the chair in Platonic philosophy at Athens instituted by Marcus Aurelius and it is far from clear that this polemic has a philosophical rather than a political motivation. One may justly infer as much from his insistence that Aristotle was an atheist, that he denied the existence of the soul, and that he rejected divine providence (p.189). Atticus thus represents yet another version of Platonism, one according to which deviation from the literal word of the master means irredeemable heretical opposition. This version turns up occasionally in contemporary scholarship, as much in the writings of defenders of Aristotle as in writings of defenders of Plato.

Ammonius Saccas, the teacher of Plotinus, is a philosopher whose thought is virtually unknown to us, but for one tantalizing fact. Porphyry, in his biography of Plotinus, tells us that he studied with Ammonius in Alexandria for eleven years and then when he came to Rome in about 245, he spent the next ten years lecturing on what he had learned from Ammonius, though he wrote nothing during that time. The reason for this was Plotinus' agreement, along with his fellow pupils, not to disclose the doctrines of Ammonius revealed to them in lectures. When those pupils later broke the agreement, Plotinus evidently no longer saw any point in refraining from writing. The natural inference is that what he wrote was what he had learned from Ammonius, with the addition of his own extensive studies in the history of philosophy. Porphyry also wrote a work On the One School of Plato and Aristotle, in which he seems to have attributed to Ammonius the view that the philosophies of Plato and Aristotle were in harmony. Scholars (including Karamanolis) are puzzled by the fact that this appears to have been the view of the man to whom Plotinus was devoted as disciple, even though Plotinus himself does not seem to embrace harmony. Karamanolis recognizes that Ammonius' view of harmony was more profound that that of either Antiochus or Plutarch (p.200). As Hierocles of Alexandria reports (1st half 4th cent. C.E.), Ammonius concluded that Plato and Aristotle were of one mind (nous) in their philosophies. What all this suggests is that Ammonius' idea was to separate the philosophical position called "Platonism" from the historical texts representing versions or interpretations or applications of this position. Its essence was a metaphysics that argued for a supersensible, unique, absolutely simple first explanatory principle of all, variously nameable as "Good" or "One". All specific philosophical problems were to be solved ultimately by reference to this first principle in its explanatory role (p.208ff). In this light, Ammonius had no difficulty in maintaining that Aristotle was an adherent of this position, even if his version of the first principle -- the Prime Unmoved Mover -- was inadequate owing to its internal complexity.

If we suppose that Plotinus' writing contains his own creative development of the doctrines of Ammonius, we might be puzzled by Plotinus' extensive criticisms of Aristotle. Yet, as Porphyry also reports in his biography, the Enneads of Plotinus are filled with "concealed Peripatetic (i.e., Aristotelian) and Stoic doctrines." Aristotle's Metaphysics, in particular, "is concentrated" in them. This makes perfectly good sense if we understand Plotinus to be building on the insight of Ammonius. His criticisms are those of a fellow Platonist. Counter to the claim of Karamanolis (p.241), Aristotle's metaphysics was not thought by Plotinus to be "considerably different" from Plato's, except in the way, for example, that Newtonian mechanics may be supposed to be "considerably different" from quantum mechanics. The latter encompasses the former; it does not negate it. It is this conception of harmony that Plotinus bequeathed to the later Platonic tradition. As Karamanolis himself shows, Plotinus' eagerness again and again to employ Aristotelian distinctions and arguments does not fit the picture of someone who is allergic to Aristotelian wisdom or of someone who believes, as did Samuel Taylor Coleridge, that "one is born either a Platonist or an Aristotelian."

The final lengthy chapter in the book is on Porphyry, by all accounts an enthusiastic harmonist. Unfortunately, many of his writings exist as no more than fragments. The fact that he had written an extensive anti-Christian polemic did not contribute to the preservation of his works when Christianity finally prevailed in the Greek world. Porphyry actually appears to have written two treatises relating to the harmony of Plato and Aristotle, the first mentioned above and another called On the Disagreement of Plato and Aristotle. As Karamanolis explains, the later work is almost certainly not in contradiction with the former (pp.245-57). It is probably a discussion of the particular differences between two philosophers who are nevertheless adherents of one philosophy. The desire to understand these differences and resolve them in the interest of philosophical truth is the main reason we have something like 15,000 extant pages of commentary on Aristotle's writings by later Platonists. It is also to Porphyry that we owe the strategy, taken up enthusiastically by Simplicius among others, of arguing that the apparent differences between Aristotle and Plato are often owing to a difference in "explanatory direction," that is, as to whether an effect or a cause of a subject phenomenon is being adduced (pp.266-70). That is to say, the difference is only apparent because the problems that were being treated were different. This strategy is applied to questions in ethics, psychology, physics, and metaphysics. Actually, Plotinus takes a similar approach, for example, when he argues that Aristotle's categories are inadequate for understanding the intelligible world, the implication being that they are perfectly suitable for the sensible world.

This book is full of high quality research and should be of interest to anyone who is not irrevocably wedded to the view that what we have in Plato's dialogues is all windup and no pitch. It also provides an excellent opportunity for the reader to explore the question of what makes one philosophical position a "version" of Platonism and another one something else.