Plato and Europe

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Patocka, Jan, Plato and Europe, translated by Petr Lom, Stanford University Press, 2002, 249pp, $19.95, ISBN 0804738017.

Reviewed by David O'Connor, University of Notre Dame


Jan Patocka (1907-1977) was a Czech philosopher who lived most of his life quietly refusing to succumb to the oppressive political forces of his native land. These forces deprived him for all but a handful of years of any regular academic employment, including the right to publish. When he died under police interrogation in his Socratic seventieth year, having been a modest participant in the Charter 77 human rights movement, he lived on as a moral hero for many Czechs, including Vaclav Havel.

This volume is not so much a book by Patocka as a memorial to him. It is appropriate that it appears in a series titled “Cultural Memory in the Present.” The translator, Petr Lom, suggests “it is likely the [English] reader encounters [Jan Patocka] for the first time” through this text (xiii). If so, this is unfortunate. This text has the kind of interest that most scholars’ notebooks or letters would have: a useful supplement for the specialist, a pleasant reminder of the human being for the friend or fan. Readers whose primary interest is not Patocka as a figure will be frustrated, especially those more engaged by Plato than by Husserl and Heidegger. A much better introduction to Patocka is the anthology, with a long intellectual biography, edited by Patocka’s first English translator, Erazim Kohák, Jan Patocka: Philosophy and Selected Writings (Chicago: University of Chicago Press, 1989).

Kohák’s own description of the text gives a very fair indication of the problems that confront the reader. “Plato and Europe is not, strictly speaking, a book,” he wrote. “The text is an unedited, verbatim transcript of a series of informal seminars held in a private apartment. The conversation ranges to and fro over Patocka’s beloved topics, Plato, Aristotle, Husserl, Heidegger, myth, and philosophy. Two of the [eleven] sessions are free discussions; the whole is only loosely held together by a concern for what for Patocka is the basis of the European idea, the care of the soul” (117). If this text were not the record of a noble man’s resistance to oppression, a testament to how simply living the life of the mind with one’s friends can become a political act, few would now see a strong reason to publish it or read it. I had the uncomfortable feeling of someone who missed the wedding but is expected to enjoy the wedding video.

The main thread of the seminar, accounting for Plato in the title, is “the care of the soul” in Democritus, Plato, and Aristotle. Patocka sees this soul-care as a response to the loss of groundedness provided originally by myth (54, 71). Reflection, which Patocka associates with philosophical wonder (59), destroys our sense of being at home and induces a state of “blind wandering” (55). This wandering is especially evident in the way reflection reveals to us the possibility of multiple perspectives (62, 72). For us, Oedipus is the great mythic exemplar of this wandering, and Socrates continues the Greek response to the tension between groundedness and wandering (49-50). More precisely, philosophical dialectic becomes the instrument that orders that bare multiplicity of clashing perspectives reflection produces (74, 77). Patocka sees this overcoming of mere perspectivalism as the core of phenomenology, and so he reads the Greek thinkers within a phenomenological idiom. “Care of the soul” is the mode of this overcoming.

Patocka discusses three main versions of soul-care. He begins by contrasting Democritus and Plato. Care of the soul in both is directed toward knowledge. Democritus is radically private, isolating the thinker from community life to orient him toward knowledge of being. Plato instead takes the primary object of knowledge to be the soul; and pursuit of this knowledge, Patocka rather abruptly insists, essentially involves an interest in politics and political reform (86, 89).

Platonic soul-care is essentially vertical: it always takes its bearings from what is, even if this highest reality cannot be made actual in the political world. (Patocka has in mind such passages as the conclusion of Republic IX, where Socrates and Glaucon agree that the best constitution is a regulative paradigm even if it will never be instantiated.) In other words, the concrete world of politics is always measured against a standard of integrity embodied, if at all, only in individual philosophers. This insistence on measure, in the face of the multiplicity of perspectives exploited by sophists, is the defining political commitment of the European tradition, and is what Patocka has in mind with the Europe of his title (89). But the text spends much less time on this political application of Platonic soul-care than on soul-care as such.

By contrast to Plato, Aristotle’s soul-care is horizontal, and allows for creative freedom in a way Plato’s does not (199-200). Aristotelian action is fundamentally creative or productive, and so is responsive to the concrete political world in a way Plato cannot be. Yet, Patocka wants to insist, Aristotelian action is as truth-directed as Platonic soul-care. Openness to the “not yet” does not exclude the standard of truth (206, 217). It is unclear in the end if Patocka finds this greater space for freedom an advantage for Aristotle.

The central goal of Platonic soul-care is what Patocka calls solidity or endurance (86-87). He means by this the achievement of settled convictions that cannot be dislodged by further dialectic examination, a kind of integrity and integration. (Patocka clearly has in mind Socrates’ critique of Callicles from the Gorgias.) But this is not quite right. It seems that the final integrity of settled conviction is beyond human beings once they have fallen into reflection. Dialectical questioning does seek complete coherence and integration, but it cannot achieve this goal. Questioning itself, it turns out, provides whatever unity Platonic soul-care can expect to achieve. Patocka seems hardly to notice as he slides back and forth between the integrity achieved through dialectical coherence and the integrity exemplified by resolute questioning (92-93), perhaps the point in the text where the disproportion becomes most egregious between Patocka’s nose for a great question and his casualness about providing an answer.

Throughout this narrative, the influence of Heidegger is clear. Patocka is trying to preserve what he can of Husserl’s call to certainty –Patocka goes so far as to call attachment to questioning a kind of epochê (92) –while taking up Heidegger’s sense of the resolute openness of philosophy. This entire set of issues about “care of the soul,” then, has little direct connection to the themes at the heart of Pierre Hadot’s and Michel Foucault’s interest in “care of the self” and spiritual exercises in antiquity. It is much more closely connected to Leo Strauss’s exchange with Alexandre Kojève in On Tyranny (Chicago: University of Chicago Press, 2000; original French edition 1954). For example, both raise the issue of whether philosophy is essentially private or political in light of the ancient atomist tradition; both see Plato or Socrates as reorienting philosophic questioning toward the soul and away from being as such; both are concerned by Aristotle’s seeming accommodations to political “realities” other than the highest good; both describe the Socratic commitment to questioning in ways reminiscent of Heidegger. This congruence is not surprising. Strauss and Kojève, without ever mentioning his name, had a constant eye on Heidegger, and particularly on the Rectoral Address, as they debated the relationship between philosophy and politics. It seems odd, then, that Petr Lom’s foreword goes out of its way to distance Patocka from Strauss (xv) (in this anticipated by Richard Rorty’s review of the French edition of Plato and Europe, New Republic 205, no.1 (July 1991), 37), especially in light of Havel’s own expressions of indebtedness to Strauss.

There is much that is stimulating in this seminar transcript, but little that is satisfying. Kohák suggested that this text “is Patocka at his finest, a philosopher at work” (117). In the same vein, Havel’s eulogy for Patocka praised “these unofficial seminars” for capturing Patocka’s “entire personality, its openness, its modesty, its humor,” and his ability to pull his audience “into the world of philosophizing” (quoted in Lom’s foreword, xv). However true such praises are of Patocka the man, they are not true of Plato and Europe the text. Almost all of the forty pages of the transcript devoted to “free discussion” could have been edited out without any loss. The questions often amount to no more than the sort of quibbles or vague alternative “big pictures” one might expect to come up in an easy-going graduate seminar. Much of Patocka’s own exposition is of the same quality: it is repetitious, lacking in interpretive detail, and vague or undeveloped on exactly the most interesting but therefore most difficult points. In short, Patocka’s transcript is suggestive and wide-ranging, but rarely a compelling read. The unedited transcripts of the seminars of most distinguished scholars would fare no better. Indeed, Dr. Johnson and Goethe would get a little old without the editorial work of Boswell and Eckermann, and Plato saw fit to make even Socrates “young and beautiful” before he put him in a book.