Plato and Levinas: The Ambiguous Out-Side of Ethics

Placeholder book cover

Tanja Staehler, Plato and Levinas: The Ambiguous Out-Side of Ethics, Routledge, 2010, 284pp., $135.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780415991803.

Reviewed by Silvia Benso, Rochester Institute of Technology


Tanja Staehler's book, Plato and Levinas: The Ambiguous Out-Side of Ethics, has many merits. It is clear, articulate, well-organized, carefully argued, and textually grounded. Staehler guides readers through some suggestive analyses of complex Platonic and Levinasian pages without losing his readers in the intricacies of the points made and the variety of the authors referenced (Kant, Hegel, Husserl, Heidegger, Merleau-Ponty, de Beauvoir). Despite a certain (helpful) didacticism, most evident in the short recapitulations appended to each chapter, the book is certainly not pedantic or boring. On the contrary, it is incredibly thought-provoking, and even passages that are well familiar to all readers of philosophy (such as the famous myth of Gyges in Plato's Republic and Gorgias) acquire new light and meaning, as well as providing renewed inspiration. The most fundamental merit of the book, however, has to do with the entirely novel and creative approach Staehler takes to a theme that has become somewhat popular among Levinas scholars -- the relation between Levinas and Plato.

In a truly Platonic but also Levinasian spirit, and following a hermeneutic methodology which she couples with more phenomenological analyses, Staehler's declared goal is "not simply to trace out Platonic influences on Levinas but rather to put Plato and Levinas in a dialogue concerning certain themes" (22). What are such themes? Certainly they include canonical themes such as ethics, politics, and the (for Levinas) difficult issue of the passage from the one to the other via the notion (by Levinas left unaddressed) of communities larger than the ethical dyad and yet smaller than the universality of humankind.

But Staehler also considers issues that even when addressed remain problematic or marginal to either one of the two thinkers, and about which each could learn from the other. Among such topics are eros, communication as speech and/or writing, art, history, the cultural world, politics understood not in its universal but rather its localized dimension. To these topics Staehler devotes some of her best analyses and arguments. The conclusion Staehler achieves at the end of the volume is the recognition of "the importance of returning to Plato's dialogues and Levinas's writings and of returning to Plato's dialogues in order to understand Levinas's writings" (227). In sum, the "radicality and uniqueness" (226) of Levinas's project can indeed benefit from a dialogue with his philosophical Greek ancestor, as Derrida (to whom a "Postscript" is devoted) has acknowledged.

The confrontation between the two thinkers has been the topic of an increasing number of essays. Yet, most of the works that have been published so far on the topic of the relation between Levinas and Plato (a relation and legacy that Levinas himself explicitly indicates at various points of his works) focus on some rather evident, immediate, even obvious (although not therefore less problematic) issues of connection, such as the concepts of eros, the good beyond being, transcendence, or metaphysical desire. The originality of Staehler's work rests on it centering instead on an idea that, at least initially, seems to play no essential part in either thinker (although it is operative in both, Staehler argues), and is certainly not thematized at length or adequately by either -- the notion of ambiguity. Whereas many scholars have excised ambiguity from Plato's thinking and have tried to turn Plato into a doctrinal thinker with a clearly defined set of statements, claims, and positions that would amount to his philosophy, through a masterful exploration of many Platonic texts (most notably, Phaedrus, Symposium, Gorgias, Statesman, Laws, Republic) Staehler offers us a more nuanced image of the Greek thinker, in whom the concept of "ambiguity" appears as a fundamental notion, one moreover capable of positively accounting for the many conceptual contradictions for which Plato has been blamed and of "complicat[ing] the dualistic sense of Platonic philosophy" (217).

The concept of ambiguity, to which Levinas devotes some brief remarks in his later work Otherwise than Being, turns out to be problematic from Levinas's perspective too. As Staehler argues, Levinas ultimately deems ethics to be "devoid of ambiguity, on the most fundamental level" (7, and chapter 12). The consequence is Levinas's difficulty in dealing with aspects of reality where ambiguities and equivocations reveal themselves most powerfully, as we learn from Staehler's analysis of Plato's treatment of three such dimensions: eros, art, and the political world in general with its notions of laws, strangers, history, and cultural phenomena. When Levinas performs a phenomenological analysis of such dimensions of existence, he is very suspicious of them and ultimately dismisses them exactly because of their ambiguity. When later, for example in Otherwise than Being, he reconsiders ambiguity more favorably, he has already abandoned the phenomenological analysis and therefore is unable to retrieve the positive ambiguity that is encapsulated in such dimensions. A reintegration of such ambiguous dimensions that situate themselves outside of ethics (hence the title of the volume) would constitute the fruitful result of the dialogue Staehler initiates between Levinas and his Greek ancestor.

The book is organized according to a fourfold partition, which follows the unfolding of a Levinasian move from ethics to politics. However, Staehler insightfully notices how for Levinas the political is made to coincide with the realm of universality, therefore de facto ignoring "intermediate communities" (5) that are "larger than two people yet smaller than all of humanity" (149) such as the various historical-cultural worlds (5). The Levinasian traditional transition from the Self (Part One) to the Other (Part Two) to the Others (Part Three) is thus supplemented in Staehler's original analysis by a further move to a consideration of historical-cultural worlds (Part Four).

Part One is concerned with an account of the self understood as an interiority that "both precedes and presupposes exteriority" (29), as powerfully revealed by (Staeheler's exciting and very plausible interpretation of) Plato's myth of Gyges. Most remarkable in this section is the emphasis that, in Staehler's acute reading, Levinas places on bodily needs, enjoyment, pleasure, happiness, and especially corporeality (understood as exposure and vulnerability) as constitutive and constituting dimensions of the self. All these dimensions "point to a profound level of passive sensibility and exposure -- which is ultimately an exposure to the Other" (66); hence the need to move to a consideration of the Other per se.

Part Two turns precisely to such a consideration of the Other in his/her relation to the Self as it is articulated in the experiences of teaching, erotic love, and finally the ethical relationship properly understood. Masterful analyses of the concepts of speech, writing, apology as self-defense, and eros in Plato's writings make their appearance here so as to show how, unlike Plato, Levinas (at least in his early writings) does not exploit all the possibilities that the phenomenological consideration of the phenomena under scrutiny would allow.

Whereas the move from Part One to Part Two is modeled after the general structure of Totality and Infinity, the move to Part Three reflects a necessary yet problematic move within Levinas's philosophy: the passage from ethics to politics, from the relation with the Other to the relation with the Third understood as the universal Other or as the universality of humankind in its demands for justice in addition (or even over) goodness. This is the Part of the book in which Staehler displays her highest speculative abilities and most original proposals. She in fact astutely notices how traditionally the move to universality is a prerogative of ethics and not of politics, as Levinas instead claims.

The helpful and necessary distinction she draws between two modalities of a plurality of others, that is, between humanity as "all the others" and the political community as "some others" leads Staehler to a consideration of the nature of the laws that rule both realms. The universality of the good, that is, Plato's "good beyond Being" that also inspires Levinas's philosophy, is the cornerstone of ethics; yet, political communities (whether understood as the whole of humanity or the more localized communities that constitute various cultural worlds) need laws that "accomplish the mediation between philosophical insights regarding stable ideas and unstable human affairs" (132). That is, "detaching politics from ethics may lead to tyranny" (128), so ethics understood in the Levinasian sense of a face-to-face relation must remain foundational.

Yet "laws are needed because whoever rules the polis cannot attend to each individual case" (133). Staehler suggests the helpful distinction between "two groups of laws" that attend to the two different sets of relations with others: "political laws" and "quasi-ethical laws" (135). As she notices, "there are no laws which would be ethical as such … . Quasi-ethical laws are closer to the realm of ethics, less in need of change and less dependent on a specific community and its traditions" (135); as an example, Staehler refers to human rights. On the other hand, political laws, although inspired by ethics, are those that define and rule specific cultural communities, and thus they vary. In this way, in line with the general focus of the book on the notion of ambiguity, "the relation between philosophy and politics has proven ambiguous; philosophy preserves as well as interrupt politics" (146).

Part Four is devoted to an analysis of four constitutive elements of such cultural worlds -- writing, art, history, and strangeness -- in the conviction that a cultural world is determined by its stories and myths. Fine explorations of the erotic, political, and artistic domains reveal how, in the treatment reserved to them by both Levinas and Plato, ambiguity, here defined as "an inherent tendency toward self-enclosure" (208), pervades them all in addition to its being an essential element of the constitution of the self and its corporeality. Since in a Levinasian mood the ethical is, however, void of ambiguity, ethics takes up "the function of criticism, checking the political means disturbing it rather than confirming it" (226), and such criticism and interruption can only come "from without not from within" (226). The book concludes with a quotation of Levinas's opening claim in Totality and Infinity: "'True life is absent' … 'But we are in the world' -- and that is not simply a misfortune," Staehler concludes (227). That is, supplementing Levinas's ethics with political, legal, cultural, and social considerations is both necessary and required.

It is difficult, for me, conceptually not to sympathize with Staehler's theoretical determination to recover to the realm of philosophical speculation domains that Levinas's marginalizes, when he does not openly dismiss them, as significant ethical phenomena. The focus on ambiguity seems to be a particularly fruitful point of entry from which to dissipate the rigidity of an exclusionary judgment that seems to be countered by the simplest, most obvious, and evident existential but also by phenomenological observations and experiences. Certainly eros, art, and politics are ways of encountering the other(s), and therefore their demotion from ethics, as it occurs in the Levinasian context, seems at least arbitrary, if not suspicious, and motivated by considerations that may well go beyond the purely philosophical. Nevertheless, one wonders whether the concept of ambiguity does not extend, or cannot be made to extend, much more widely and radically than the limits to which Staehler is willing to take it. In other words, could one not say that, already in Levinas, ambiguity is a fundamental dimension of ethics itself and that it therefore permeates the most fundamental aspect of Levinas's philosophy?

For Levinas, ethics is in fact not simply the dimension of the absolutely Other. Rather, ethics names the "relation without relation" within which the encounter between the self and the Other can take place. True, the Other is an absolute Other, and in that sense the Other remains separate, transcendent, unambiguous, pure and uncompromised. Yet ethics itself is the realm of the constant (re)negotiation between self-absorption, self-reduction, self-centeredness and totalitarianism and such an Other that, despite its metaphysical nature, becomes approachable (although not accessible) precisely through the ethical modalities as they are articulated at various places of Levinas's works.

In that sense, is ethics not the domain of ambiguity par excellence? Is ethics not itself ambiguous? The Other is both there in the immediacy and evidence of the face and yet not there in the impossibility of any phenomenology of such a face. The command of the Other is present in the eyes that demand immediate response and responsibility and yet such a command derives its authority from a past that is anarchic, beyond representation or remembrance. The content of the ethical imperative is both absolutely clear and unambiguous -- "you shall not kill" -- and yet undefined in the specificity of its application (Levinas is not interested in giving us a set of moral codes and rules of behavior).

Every single aspect of Levinas's ethics could be deconstructed in the search for elements of ambiguity within it, and this reviewer has no doubt that the search would be highly successful (beside being interesting and philosophically inspiring). The very title of Levinas's first major book seems to indicate that much -- Totality and Infinity, where the "and" descriptively holds together and yet opposes (the first ambiguity) two categories that in Levinas's understanding of them prove to be at odds. The same could be said of ethics and politics, the Other and the Third, the saying and the said, and many other crucial notions.

If this is the case though (i.e., if ambiguity is a fundamental dimension of ethics) is ethics not closer to those phenomena Levinas rules out exactly because (at least in Staehler's rendition) of their ambiguous aspects? Or is ambiguity not a category that may help in bringing them to a hearing? Moreover, and more fundamentally, what are the philosophical implications of electing ambiguity as the crucial category of one's thinking? Other thinkers, most notably Kierkegaard (but perhaps also Nietzsche and, much earlier, Heraclitus), have proposed analogous categories while resorting to rather different philosophical positions than the one taken up by Levinas. How might a Levinasian concept of ambiguity rather than, for example, paradox or contradiction, become fruitful for future philosophical speculations? How might it modify our conceptual and categorical apparatus? How might it change the sense, nature, path, and task of philosophizing? What might it do to philosophy? These are questions that Staehler's precious book does not formulate, articulate, or address but certainly opens up for future thinking.