Plato and Nietzsche: Their Philosophical Art

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Mark Anderson, Plato and Nietzsche: Their Philosophical Art, Bloomsbury, 2014, 225pp., $112.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781472522047.

Reviewed by Robert Guay, Binghamton University


My initial impression of this book was that it is strikingly bad. It seems noncommittal about most of its own interpretive claims, it regularly lapses into broad summaries, it opposes the views of anonymous “scholars” (13, 109, 137, 197) rather than engaging substantially with existing scholarship, and it fails to provide a compelling justification for its subject matter. Indeed, it hardly discusses what sort of a shared “philosophical art” Plato and Nietzsche might have had. All this complicates the typical procedure of a review, so in what follows I will try to explain the basis of my initial impression and then offer a reason why this impression should be amended.

The book is not primarily about art or about the philosophical texts as artworks. Those topics do arise in the book, especially in the first and fifth chapters. But most of the book consists of a series of contrasts between Plato and Nietzsche on very general, mostly metaphysical topics. These topics usually, but not always, relate thematically to the chapter titles: “Art and Reason,” “Being,” “Becoming,” “Noble and Good,” and “Sophia and Philosophia.” The fifth and final chapter, furthermore, takes up the issue of how to categorize Plato and Nietzsche’s approach to writing.

The basis, I think, of my initial impression is that the book has an unusual enterprise that matches up poorly with typical expectations. It focuses on the authors themselves as viewed through their “representative ideas” (vii). This might seem normal enough, but here the emphasis is really on the persons who wrote the texts and made the arguments rather than the texts and the arguments themselves. So the book aims at “gaining insight into the workings of Nietzsche’s mind” (7) or understanding “Plato the man as a paradigm of the philosophical life” (15). To be sure, I attribute views to Plato and Nietzsche, but it never occurred to me to care about Plato and Nietzsche themselves; if there were a dinner party for the dead, I would have some questions about the epistles and eternal recurrence, but would otherwise just hope they brought good wine. We have the written works to care about. So when Mark Anderson writes, “We cannot read Plato’s mind” (51) or, “so I imagine Nietzsche would say” (176), then it seems to me that the focus has been misplaced. The sort of inquiry the ideal of which would be mind-reading and imagined conversations is a faulty one.

Of course, one could conduct an inquiry that examined the persons on the basis of their works. But then it would be a mistake to focus on representative ideas. Anderson himself provides two reasons that undermine his approach. He writes that Plato and Nietzsche are “challenging primarily because their work is often much richer than is evident from the easily accessible surface meanings.” (9) If that is so, then one should not begin by reducing the works to a few representative doctrines. Nietzsche is then represented poorly: will to power stands as a “concise statement of Nietzsche’s position” (86) and “Nihilism, the rejection of metaphysics, the denial of Being, the death of God” (75) are all expressions that we may use “interchangeably” (75). Plato fares even worse, since there is little besides the priority of Being over Becoming, the immortality of the soul, and some heterodox theological beliefs to represent him.

The other main reason why it is a mistake to focus on representative ideas is implicit here: “Nietzsche is more challenging, and therefore more inspiring, when at his business of unsettling paradigms” (91). Here we have a genuinely Nietzschean idea: that our attention to philosophy is redeemed not in conveying truths but in challenging or inspiring or unsettling us. But if our aim is to take Plato and Nietzsche as Educators in Nietzsche’s sense, then we are more or less bound to misunderstand their ideas. Nietzsche thought, at any rate, that the sorts of exemplars that could have such a transformative effect will inevitably be “encompassed by a net of misunderstandings” and that the love and reverence they provoke are not conducive to clear insight.1

At the very least, there seems to be an inconsistency in the book between its declared goal, of conveying something like Plato’s and Nietzsche’s points of view as authors, and its actual content, which is dominated by discussion of abstract doctrines. I doubt that extracting the ideas from their context and forms of expression does much service to either the thinkers or the ideas. Most of the book, however, is taken up with presenting and subsequently withdrawing a series of oppositions between Plato and Nietzsche on general topics.

Each chapter identifies a very general theme. Almost all the discussion consists of competent, well-informed summaries of texts, and less sophisticated summaries of philosophical positions. (Here is one example of the latter: “The idea that the truth does not exist independently of the human mind, but that humans really are the measure of at least some things, is relativism” (122). This definition of relativism is compatible with idealism, or realism, or almost anything else. Fortunately this does not seem to matter for the discussion in which it appears.) In between the summaries, there is approximately one polemical point of comparison in each chapter, so I will attend to these.

This is an example from the first chapter, which comes immediately after a complaint about Nietzsche having treated Plato as a “moralist”:

Why would Nietzsche manipulate Plato in this way? Surely by now it is obvious that Plato was no philistine. The problem, I think, is that Plato’s perspective on art was just too different from Nietzsche’s. Nietzsche could not, or would not, consistently acknowledge either the depth of Plato’s appreciation of art or the magnitude of his artistic gifts because he was disconcerted and confused by the fact that Plato stood in an altogether different relation to art than he did himself. And here I do not mean to stress Plato’s ethical-political relation to art, but rather his existential relation. He does not seem to have been dependent on art in the specific ways that Nietzsche required it. (30)

This, incidentally, has the general template of the oppositions that are set up in the book. Nietzsche sets up a polemical contrast, in this case about perspectives on art, that Anderson finds “downright baffling” (152; cf. 29). He then insists that Nietzsche must have willfully misread Plato, and this willfulness must be the product of a psychological need on Nietzsche’s part. And in this way any substantial opposition is obscured. There are a number of deep issues that could have been discussed here: the need for a particular kind of paideia (or Bildung) to sustain a culture, the role of art in such a paideia, the rational standing of artistic creation, and whether a social regulation of art is possible. But instead we only hear of Nietzsche’s failure to appreciate the “magnitude of [Plato’s] artistic gifts.” Understanding Nietzsche’s position in this way is either the biographical fallacy or a non-philosophical inquiry.

The book’s main contrast between Plato and Nietzsche arises in Chapter 2, however: Plato was an advocate of Being, whereas Nietzsche “denied Being” (65) and was therefore an advocate of Becoming. This might indeed be an informative generalization, but what does it mean? This initial formulation is metaphysical, so that the dispute is over what is fundamentally real, but there are some incongruities here. Anderson writes, “We might wonder how seriously to take Nietzsche’s criticism of Being given that he neglects to do the hard work required to engage with Plato’s ideas on their own advanced level of development” (61). This should present us with a couple of interpretive options: either Nietzsche sees his engagement with Plato as concerning the nature of reality, but he is very bad at it, or Nietzsche is less concerned with the nature of reality than with what might be called the “protopictures” that set up the terms for our philosophical engagement with the world and how we might become more aware of and critical towards them.2

In any case, the terrain quickly shifts from the metaphysical to the epistemological:

For Plato, something about the nature of the objects themselves determines their knowability or otherwise; for us moderns, it is rather something about the nature of the objects as subject to investigation by our five senses, which we take to be a human’s only paths to knowledge. We have, in short, accepted the inversion of Being and Becoming that began among the ancients . . . and reached its zenith in Nietzsche’s philosophy. (58)

This reduces a complex of issues — axiological, historical, and personal, in addition to metaphysical — between Plato and Nietzsche and “us moderns” into what appears to be a contrast between direct realism and empiricism, and then it attributes Nietzsche’s priority of Becoming over Being, however strange and radical such a position is supposed to be, to all of us. I get the impression that the details of the interpretation do not particularly matter; as Anderson sometimes writes, “technical precision is not necessary for our purposes” (197; cf. 50, 113).

Before addressing what those purposes might be, there are a couple of other features of Anderson’s reading that are worth considering. Here is one from Chapter 3. Anderson writes, “I said . . . that for Nietzsche the world is flux through and through and all the way down, and if this is so then in this world there are no substances with determinate, fixed natures to which our interpretations must conform to capture the truth” (107). This strikes me as incoherent: it asserts a metaphysical realist position about “flux” in order to say that realism is impossible because a different kind of realism must hold in order for truth to be possible. But however we parse that, there is a deeper question for Nietzsche interpretation here: why should we care about the metaphysics? Nietzsche and Plato are clearly interested in ethical and cultural phenomena, and Anderson represents those interests as dependent on “metaphysical support” (67). But it is not clear why it does not work the other way around: that the apparent metaphysics is a superstructural way of making sense of the ethical concerns that were already there rather than the basis for the ethics. Indeed, the Socratic combination of a profession of ignorance along with attention to care for the soul might be a way of indicating this. Similarly, perhaps, Nietzsche insisted that the “bold lunacies of metaphysics . . . may always be considered first of all as symptoms.”3

Here is one last point of contrast, from Chapter 4. Anderson writes, “Given these facts . . . we must regard Nietzsche’s assertion that Socrates and Plato were ‘tools of the Greek dissolution, pseudo-Greek, anti-Greek’ as an eruption of hyperbolic rhetoric” (120). Nietzsche’s rhetoric may indeed have been hyperbolic, but I suspect there is a failure here to see his points at all. Nietzsche was concerned with the nature of reasons (or “Gründe”) on one hand, and with cultural decline on the other. So for Nietzsche, the need to locate a ground for our grounds in something timeless and removed from our ordinary desires marks a flaw both in our sense of ourselves as persons and at the same time in the culture that admits such extraordinary demands. Nietzsche might be wrong here. But there is no way to assess that without seeing his point to begin with.

Strangely enough, none of the contrasts between Plato and Nietzsche have much to do with the book’s main conceit, however. This conceit is expressed in terms of the reasons for calling Plato or Nietzsche a “thinker-artist” (181) or perhaps “a sage writing as an artist writing as a philosopher” (168), but it can be expressed apart from a concern about nomenclature. The conceit is something like this: one should attend to the standpoint of the authors as producers of artistic works, rather than merely the statements in the texts, in order to understand their philosophical enterprises. This is a deep point, and here is one formulation of it:

I study the dialogues as artistic wholes, not for the light this approach may shed on a dialogue’s argument or arguments, but rather for insight into Plato’s activity as a philosopher and as an artist. Socrates has long been our model of the philosophical life, but it seems to me that when thinking about the nature of philosophy and the activity of the philosopher we would do well to attend more closely to Plato. (15)

The odd thing about the book is that there is very little attention to “artistic wholes” either in terms of references to secondary literature or simply in terms of discussing texts as wholes. But the deeper point about Socrates seems to me apt: Socrates is a terrible model for us of the philosophical life. The Apology is something frequently taught in Intro Phil, and I’m sure it has its pedagogical value. But the Socratic model of the philosopher is someone who triumphs over conversational opponents, relies on irony and verbal tricks, is moved by unrecognizable passions, and is fascinated by death. In our practice of philosophy, by contrast, we are writers first of all, sometimes we publish (even when no one reads it), we have modes of discourse other than elenchus and proof, we try to engage with others’ concerns, and we sometimes try to address at least some of the more pressing problems that arise in leading a life.

So what redeems this book is that it raises a deep question about what it might mean for us to be philosophers and writers. This should provoke, on one hand, some insight into Plato’s and Nietzsche’s enterprises (or perhaps even their common “art”) as writers, and on the other hand some insight into what we can take away from Plato and Nietzsche for our own philosophical practice. I do not know what that insight is supposed to be, however. So my overall impression of the book is of a thoroughly considered, extensively researched, interesting enterprise that never manages to communicate the great esteem it has for Plato and Nietzsche.4

1 Friedrich Nietzsche, “Schopenhauer as Educator,” in Untimely Meditations, transl. R.J. Hollingdale, New York: Cambridge University Press, 1983, section 3.

2 I borrow the term “protopictures,” perhaps somewhat incongruously, from Warren Goldfarb, “I Want You to Bring Me a Slab,” Synthese 56:3 (1983), 265-282, at 280.

3 Friedrich Nietzsche, The Gay Science, transl. J. Nauckhoff, New York: Cambridge University Press, 2001, Preface section 2.

4 I am grateful to Jenn Dum, Charles Griswold, and Randall Havas for discussing this review with me. They did not contribute in any way to my review’s shortcomings.