Plato and the Poets

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Pierre Destrée and Fritz-Gregor Herrmann (eds.), Plato and the Poets, Brill, 2011, 434pp., $217.00 (hbk), ISBN 9789004201293.

Reviewed by Christopher Moore, Penn State University


It is perhaps because most contemporary scholars consider themselves philopoiêtai, "art-partisans" (Rep. 607d), that Plato's challenges to the poetic arts are so provocative. They are even more poignant given that Plato appears philopoiêtês himself: he cites poets, deploys poeticizing tropes, and adopts literary genres throughout all his writing. All the same, Plato never depicts Socrates talking to poets except the dramatists in the Symposium, where they talk mainly about love; never has Socrates ask, "What is poetry?"; and never has some other character precisely define "poet," "poetry," or "poem."

The attitude among the majority of the nineteen papers in Plato and the Poets is that, for Plato, philosophy is better than poetry. The interpretative burden is to explain why. This is a very long, serious, and high-quality book (402 pages of text), dense with arguments, excellent observations, and provocative dialectics. It is neither a text about the poetics of Plato nor specifically about his use of poetic quotation or allusion. It focuses principally on two puzzles: the position of mimêsis in the criticism of poetry (and particularly whether it differs between Rep. III and X), and the irrationality and fecundity of the poet's manic inspiration. The book also presents, to a smaller degree, reflections on Plato's contrasts between poets and sophists, his idea of tragedy, and the way he sets up and hurdles over particular poetic material.

Despite these large clusters of shared interest, there is no cross-referencing among the papers. There may be some aporetic benefit for a reader confronting such "contradictions and incompatibilities" (xiv), but there is also the cost consequent to foregoing the search for consensus. This brings to mind the idea that Plato's concern with poetry may come in part from the fact, as he sees it, that poems often speak at cross-purposes (157n8).

I will discuss a few of the book's most interesting themes, addressing only some of the papers in any detail.

I. Plato's use of poetry

Socrates says in the Republic that he and Plato's brothers might have to inform poetry about the ancient quarrel between it and philosophy. Glenn Most ("What Ancient Quarrel between Philosophy and Poetry?") argues that Plato most likely invented this quarrel. Anyway, we do not see any evidence of it before him. Xenophanes, a philosopher famous for critiquing Homeric and Hesiodic theology, himself wrote poetry, and seems to have been contesting the truth of the epic world-views, not its mode of presentation. Heraclitus criticized everybody who deemed himself wise, Pythagoras and Hecataeus as much as Hesiod and Archilochus. Archaic poetry appears not to mark out philosophers for criticism. (In fact, "philosophy" words are not extant in poetry until Aristophanes' Ecclesiasuzae of 391, and even there not derisively). Comedians writing during Plato's life depicted characters ridiculing intellectuals, but this hardly counts as an "ancient quarrel," and certainly not one between "poetry" and "philosophy".

This latter point is worth reinforcing, since the nature of any such quarrel is hard to grasp. How could "philosophy" -- a commitment to a kind of life, a set of critical tools against proponents of wisdom, eventually a literature -- quarrel with "poetry" -- itself a commitment to a kind of life, a set of critical tools against proponents of wisdom, a literature? Is it simply that people who philosophize think that people who produce, consume, or appreciate poetry (the philopoiêtai) have the wrong priorities, and the proponents of poetry think the same of the philosophers? Glenn Most does not speculate (but see Halliwell, p. 252, for a view). The upshot of this paper is that we must interpret Socrates' observation as something other than an acknowledgement of an historical quarrel. This is an important starting point for understanding Socrates' and Plato's conception of "philosophy" and "poetry" as disciplinary names for long-standing cultural values.

Plato's Symposium shows how Plato deploys dramatic irony to undermine the philopoiêtai's use of poetry. Elizabeth Belfiore ("Poets and the Symposium") argues that the dialogue's first five symposiasts, in their poetic citations, reveal their failure to think about anything other than the charm of their context-shorn quotations. Phaedrus's praise for erôs (love) as a precondition for courage employs poetic quotations from poems that in fact state that wisdom is the true precondition, and that erotic passion without thoughtfulness leads to disaster. Pausanias' analysis of erôs into contrasting Aphroditic and vulgar forms falters on the fact that the poetry he alludes to treats even Aphrodite as morally compromised. Eryximachus misquotes Heraclitus, who, while not called a poet, favors the poetic gnomic style. Aristophanes' vivid story of separation and reunion does not investigate whether his epic sources would really valorize the reunion erôs supposedly seeks. Agathon suppresses his sources' claims that erôs can be bad and contradicts himself about erôs's nature.

Socrates' Diotima, on the other hand, while she references poetry, neither quotes it selectively, nor treats it as authoritative about love. "The lover who is initiated into the Greater Mysteries has an experience unlike any in the poetic tradition, [and] to further emphasize this point, Diotima avoids any quotation from or explicit mention of poetry in this part of her speech." So in the dialogue's first half, we see the inadequacy of the philopoiêtai; in Socrates' speech, we see the inadequacy of the poetic tradition itself (at least according to Diotima). This paper does not show that any particular poetic view of love is actually false; it instead criticizes those who assume, without philosophical investigation, that any set of poetic views of love must be true simply because some poetic lines state them.

In a paper on a similar topic -- Plato on the erôs-describing poets -- Elisabeth Pender comes to a similar view about the Phaedrus ("A Transfer of Energy: Lyric Eros in Phaedrus"). Plato uses lyric allusion to develop some views of love, but eventually "breaks with the poetic tradition to reveal the correct way to convert the energy of erôs." Pender's argument is that "Plato's allusions to the lyric poets are integral to his account of the soul in love," but the paper does not make clear what would have happened if Plato did not allude to the lyric poets.

II. The kinship of philosophy and poetry

Three papers in particular work out the view that Socrates and the philosophers have considerable poetic sympathies. The first, by Francisco J. Gonzalez, argues that Socrates, like the poets and rhapsodes, is, with the other philosophers, himself madly inspired, and lacks any definitive expertise ("The Hermeneutics of Madness: Poet and Philosopher in Plato's Ion and Phaedrus"). Both poetry and philosophy bear "the message of a reality that transcends them." But their respective attitude to "hermeneusis" -- a concept meaning either "transmitter" or "interpreter" -- may divide them. The non-philosophical poet takes himself simply to transpose divine messages into human speech; he forgoes collation, interpretation, or critique. (This out-of-his-mind imitative poet, who to the extent he is out of his mind cannot engage in rational reflection, and who is not a very good imitator either, is the topic of Catherine Collobert's "Poetry as Flawed Reproduction: Possession and Mimesis.) The careful philosopher, on the other hand, engages rationally with his "inspired glimpses of a divine reality by seeking to understand this reality and relating it to the reality immediately surrounding him." But this contrast, Gonzalez admits, is only an approximate one. Poetry could reflect on itself, acknowledge its dim imprecision, and know itself to be interpretation and not a window onto pure truth. Philosophy could make the opposite move, forgetting its technical limitations, seeing itself as providing unadulterated access to the eternal verities, and obscuring from itself its status as mediated and tentative. To be philosophical, then, is to be vigilant -- sôphron -- about one's erotic mania.

Stefan Büttner ("Inspiration and Inspired Poets in Plato's Dialogues") acknowledges the frequency with which Plato accepts the possibility of inspiration and admires its benefits. The experience of inspiration is in some way part of nous, akin to forethought and foresight, lacking mainly the systematic rationality of other modes of intellection. The success of good poets, which "transcends any simple categorization of experiences," comes from their ability "to understand character so profoundly, that they can accurately anticipate the actions of those characters and the good or evil which results from their action." The philosopher, as we see especially in the example of Socrates and the Phaedrus' charioteer, can harness inspiration, and make it part of his activity: "he can be inspired by the object of his thought; and he can justify his thought." (A similar idea is found in Dominic Scott, "Plato, Poetry and Creativity". He shows that in the Symposium the philosopher and the poet both engage in recollection, the poet only more characteristically haphazardly and incompletely; the Ion and Meno differ from the longer dialogue in holding the philosopher and poet further apart.)

Stephen Halliwell ("Antidotes and Incantations: Is There a Cure for Poetry in Plato's Republic?") addresses the fact that Socrates, and Plato, and the readers of the Republic, are all philopoiêtai. Is Socrates really eager to "banish" his love of poetry from himself? Halliwell answers no. Throughout Book X Socrates undercuts his arguments against poetry with his repeated "indications of lingering if equivocal 'love' of poetry." Socrates' arguments should be understood "not as statements of an established position," nor as "the 'drug' or 'antidote' or knowledge needed to combat the psychological harm of mimetic poetry," but as "incitements to recognize the need for a new and better understanding of artistic mimesis." The Republic dispenses no cure for poetry; the relationship between poetry and philosophy remains an "unsolved, abiding problem."

Halliwell's basic argument is that Socrates admits the Book X arguments to be insecure and open to defeat. He calls them "spells" rather than philosophical knowledge, and he asserts that he must use them constantly, rather than deploying them once and for all. Socrates is committed to philosophical ideals, but does not have the full immunity granted by the "transcendent knowledge of the good." Socrates seeks not to become deaf to poetry but "to find an ethical justification for continuing to have [the] experience [of poetic enchantment]." In this way Plato shows that the model life, Socrates', seeks to welcome both philosophy and poetry, all the while recognizing the intense difficulty in doing so. (Carlotta Capuccino, "Plato's Ion and the Ethics of Praise," takes the opposing view that poetry deploys "groundless praise" and "promotes a dogmatic and passive style of life and thought," and so is "essentially incompatible with philosophy.")

III. The Two Republic Accounts

Halliwell claims that Socrates' remarks about poetry early and late in the Republic differ because the earlier remarks, told during the construction of the ideal state, are oriented toward poetry in education and soul formation, while the latter, told after the state has been constructed, are oriented toward the committed "philosophical" poetry-lover. Alternative solutions to integrating the two "critiques" of poetry (of Books III and X) occupy the contributions by Rachel Singpurwalla, Pierre Destrée, Jera Marusic, and Gabriel Richardson Lear.

Singpurwalla's paper ("Soul Division and Mimesis in Republic X") is wonderfully clear and persuasive, if admittedly more about appearance than about mimesis or poetry. She aims to explain why Book III involves a tripartite view of the soul while Book X has a bipartite view, and to see the relevance of this for aesthetic issues. Socrates infers a bipartite soul in Book X, she agues, from his observations of optical illusions and artworks: even after using rational calculation to determine how something really is, we may still be captivated by its initial look. Socrates affirms a tripartite soul in Book III, in contrast, because he accepts three categories of value or goals, and each needs its own soul-part, appetitive, spirited, and rational. These two accounts are coherent: "the appetitive part . . . is prone to form . . . judgments of value on the basis of . . . appearances of value." The relevance to poetry follows from the conclusion that "strong attractions prevent us from looking past the appearances, or from engaging in more sophisticated forms of reasoning about the value of the object of our attraction." The way poetry appeals to the appetitive part of the soul is the way it causes unthinking valuation.

Destrée ("Poetry, Thumos, and Pity in the Republic") unites the early and late Republic theories by showing their shared concern with the thumoeides, a person's spirited aspect. Destrée accepts that "banishing tragic poetry is of crucial importance . . . in the whole project of the Republic," for courage -- which the tragic world view corrodes -- is key both in the face of death and misfortune and in the face of obstacles to "one's desire for moral goodness." The spirited part of the soul, made explicit earlier in the Republic, is left implicit in the final book, but Plato's diffidence later on does not mean the psychology in the final book does not assume it.

Marusic ("Poets and Mimesis in the Republic") deals with the puzzle that poetic mimesis seems different in the earlier and later parts of the Republic. She rejects the linguistic explanation (as in, e.g., Notomi, p. 311) that Socrates first deploys a "narrower" sense (as dramatic enactment in contrast with narration) and later a "wider" sense (as all artistic depiction) of the term. Her rejection depends both on specific textual interpretation and on the principle that one should not simply replace argumentative difficulties with semantic ones. She argues instead that mimesis has one meaning -- intentional likeness to some other activity or thing -- but that of course the content and context of that intentional likening may differ. Book III mimesis is not deceptive -- a spectator knows Homer is not Chryses. Book X mimesis, on the other hand, may deceive those who do not realize the producer merely seems like, but is not the same as, some expert. On this interpretation, Plato's position that poetic activity is mimesis is innovative and not readily apparent. It follows from the fact that poets do not have knowledge of that about which they speak, but aim to seem as though they do, and some listeners do not realize that poets lack knowledge. For if they did not lack knowledge, they would not be intending to be like something else; they would simply be it. (Fritz-Gregor Herrmann, "Poetry in Plato's Gorgias," addresses a question similar to Marusic's: why does the Gorgias speak about poetry not in terms of mimesis but as "rhetoric with meter"? Herrmann answers that mimesis does play an (implicit) role in the shorter dialogue, in that becoming good depends on following an image, and appealing to a crowd's or tyrant's pleasure involves "imitating" those people.)

Lear ("Mimesis and Psychological Change in Republic III), like Marusic, argues that despite seeming differences, mimesis in Books III and X is the same. Her view, however, is that all mimesis is appearance-making. Plato's principal criticism in Book III, then, is not of the constant acting out of unsavory characters, but coming to love the creation of appearances as such, and the more appearances the better. The person who acts in diverse ways will not very easily be able to be just one way.

IV. Other Papers

Penelope Murray ("Tragedy, Women and the Family in Plato's Republic") argues that much of the Republic is structured to eliminate what Plato saw as the effeminate and the domestic. Noburu Notomi ("Image-Making in Republic X and the Sophist: Plato's Criticism of the Poet and the Sophist) shows that Plato charges both the poet and the sophist with image-making. Gretchen Reydams-Shils ("Myth and Poetry in the Timaeus") deals with Socrates' puzzling remark that his description of an ideal state was like a painting. Antony Hatzistavrou ("'Correctness' and Poetic Knowledge: Choric Poetry in the Laws") defends the claim that "a work of art is beautiful if and only if it successfully represents a beautiful original". This means that a choric poet could go wrong in two dimensions. The argument proceeds in a clever fashion, bringing together five seemingly inconsistent theses about aesthetic value in Laws 655-668. Susan Sauvé Meyer ("Legislation as a Tragedy: On Plato's Laws VII, 817B-D") writes that since tragedy is about the best life, the truest tragedy, which the Magnesian legislators are composing, "is the composition whose pronouncements on these topics [i.e., the best life] are most correct."

V. Final Remarks

The relationship between philosophy and poetry matters to a philosopher if poetry could conceivably seem a viable alternative to the philosophical way of life. Readers might have appreciated a stronger focus in this collection on the potential or putative benefits of poetry, and the potential or putative weaknesses of philosophy. Why might someone already philosophically minded wonder whether something in that practice would not, as directly as poetry, fulfill some requirement for living the wise, happy, and good life? What is the justification, or explanation, for being a philopoetês? Readers might also wish they had seen a paper on Socrates' reading of Simonides' poem in the Protagoras, which, despite its levity and Socrates' later dismissive attitude, displays perhaps the closest engagement between philosophy and poetry in Plato. All the same, this collection reveals a startling richness of questions about Plato's writings on poetry.