Plato and The Stoics

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A. G. Long (ed.), Plato and The Stoics, Cambridge University Press, 2013, 199pp., $90.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781107040595.

Reviewed by Jacob Klein, Colgate University


This collection of seven essays is a valuable addition to the growing number of studies dealing with Plato's influence on early Stoicism and Stoicism's relationship to Platonism generally.[1] It offers fresh interpretations of several recent controversies and takes up a number of new issues, focusing especially on questions of transmission, reception and response.

Malcolm Schofield's "Cardinal Virtues: A Contested Socratic Inheritance" considers a "beginning episode" in Stoic thinking about the leading virtues, taking off from a puzzling feature of the theory ascribed to Zeno: Zeno is said by Plutarch to have made practical wisdom (phronêsis) the essence of moderation, courage, and justice. If Zeno also recognized phronêsis as a leading virtue in its own right, this makes phronêsis both the basis of virtue and one of its cardinal instances. Max Pohlenz's solution to this puzzle interpolates an unattested distinction between primary and secondary forms of phronêsis into one of Plutarch's reports (Stoic. rep. 1034c). Schofield's account instead takes Plutarch at face value, suggesting that Zeno need not have treated the primary virtues as coordinate with one another and finding precedent for this at Phaedo 69a-c and Laws 688b, where phronêsis is similarly essential to the other virtues.

This reconstruction of Zeno's theory sets the stage for Schofield's main hypothesis. Plutarch tells us (Stoic. rep. 1034d) that Cleanthes added control (enkrateia) to the list of leading virtues along with wisdom, moderation and justice. In this scheme phronêsis no longer functions as one of the leading virtues but rather as their common basis, describable in physical terms as the tensional strength of the soul itself. Schofield suggests that in elevating enkrateia to the rank of cardinal virtue Cleanthes looked not to Platonic precedent but to the ideal of Socratic strength in Antisthenes and Xenophon. Chrysippus then effected a kind of synthesis, restoring the Platonic list of cardinal virtues and making scientific knowledge (epistêmê) their foundation.

This account adheres scrupulously to what evidence we have, and if Schofield is correct to posit Xenophon and Antisthenes as sources for Cleanthes' theory, it illustrates the range of influences on early Stoicism as well as disagreements "over the proper interpretation of [Stoicism's] Socratic inheritance" (11). It also raises puzzles of its own: Schofield suggests that Cleanthes' exclusion of phronêsis from the list of leading virtues leaves little scope for practical deliberation in its own right. And this might lead us to wonder what enkrateia, conceived as a capacity for "persistence in what is manifestly called for" (Stoic. rep. 1034d) is supposed to persist in. It is not clear to me why this is a problem for Cleanthes' view as Schofield reconstructs it. Why should enkrateia not be conceived as a capacity for adhering to the practical judgments that belong to the other leading virtues? Schofield's essay is in any case beautifully clear and succinct, its conclusions complementing, Schofield notes, those of recent studies by J.-B. Gourinat and Thomas Bénatouïl.[2]

Gretchen Reydams-Schils's ambitious essay, "The Academy, the Stoics and Cicero on Plato's Timaeus," argues that Stoic physics reflects a direct engagement with the Timaeus and also that scholars have overestimated the early Academy's influence on Stoic physical theory. On the latter point, Reydams-Schils disagrees -- overtly, it must be said -- with the conclusions of John Dillon and David Sedley: they "underestimate the complexities of the hermeneutics of rivalry and co-optation" (29). Her own conclusion is that the Old Academy did not clearly abandon a commitment to "transcendent first principles" and so is unlikely to have played the influential role Dillon and Sedley envision. To show this, she reconsiders the main fragments dealing with physics in the Old Academy, as well as Cicero's (recently much-discussed) report at Academica 1.24-29.

There is some tension here, in my view, between the claim that Stoic physics took its inspiration from Plato and the claim that it did not take it from the early Academy. Dillon and Sedley can agree with much of Reydams-Schils's compelling case for the Stoics' direct engagement with the Timaeus, but this case does not by itself exclude, and might even suggest, some formative role for the Academy -- particularly when coupled with independent evidence that Zeno studied with Polemo and the questionable but nonetheless explicit testimony of Cicero that Zeno adapted Polemo's system in other areas.[3] To emphasize the influence of Plato while casting doubt on that of his immediate successors, one needs a positive case for supposing that physical theory in the Academy developed away from, rather than toward, the two-principle physics of early Stoicism. If we discount the Antiochean account of the Academica, as Reydams-Schils does, the latter can only rest on our meager additional evidence for early Academic views. Reydams-Schils's reassessment of this evidence, especially the Theophrastan fragment that is the key to Sedley's account, is perhaps the crucial point in her analysis.

Jenny Bryan's "Chrysippus and Plato on the Fragility of the Head" is a fine addition to the comparatively slight literature on the problem of evil in Stoic theory. Chrysippus thought that illness and disease could be explained as "necessary concomitants" of nature's creative aims, and he illustrated this, Gellius says (Noc. Att. 7.1.1-13), by the example of the skull's fragility, a clear appropriation of Timaeus 75c-d. Drawing on Sedley's analysis of the Timaeus passage, Bryan gives an account of the sort of necessity at issue here, or rather, of the sort of necessity that is not: the skull's fragility cannot be explained by the brute recalcitrance of matter (as some have explained the Timaeus example) since "Stoic matter is entirely passive" (71-72). It must be rooted, instead, in limitations on the combinations of properties matter can sustain (what this difference comes to is not entirely clear).

Bryan also notes and neatly resolves a further puzzle: Plato appeals to the head as the seat of sensation and reason to explain its delicate structure. Chrysippus cannot have adopted this account wholesale, however, because the Stoic hêgemonikon is centered in the heart. Bryan's translation of Gellius' report avoids this difficulty, taking Gellius' mention of ratio subtilior as a reference not to the head as a locus of reason but to the "more refined reasoning" that characterizes rational nature's "choice of a frangible skull" (76).

Paul Scade's "Plato and the Stoics on Limits, Parts and Wholes" argues that Chrysippus recognized two kinds of limit: (1) geometrical limits (points, surfaces and lines) as defined, in the Stoic scheme, by the tensional properties of objectively individuated objects, and (2) limits as "arbitrarily imposed mental constructs" (81). This distinction "explains the apparent disagreement between those sources that describe limits as incorporeal and those that talk about infinite division" (83). Scade finds precedents for both kinds of limit in the intricacies of the Parmenides' third and seventh deductions: parts and wholes are said to be unlimited in number (158b) and limits graspable in thought (165a-b).

Scade's account of geometrical limits as incorporeals depending on the tensional properties of corporeal objects is convincing, but it is not wholly clear to me where the pressure to introduce an additional, "mentally constructed" kind of limit comes from. There is, Scade notes, no textual evidence that requires us to understand limits in this way.[4] Scade's case is rather based on a distinction between "the type of parts we can identify and enumerate and the type of parts that we cannot" (89). Scade sees grounds for this distinction in the Stoic analysis of infinite division, but the passage of Plutarch to which he turns (Comm. not. 1079b-c) does not, as far as I can see, attribute to Chrysippus a distinction between determinate and indeterminate, "mentally constructed" parts but only the less committal claim that there is no determinate number of ultimate parts an object has.

Somewhat puzzling too is Scade's reliance throughout on a contrast between incorporeals and "mental constructs". I think it is now generally agreed that not all incorporeals are mind-dependent, but it does not seem to be settled that all of them are not. In particular, the Stoic claim that incorporeal lekta subsist (huphistasthai) in accordance with rational impressions might be thought to make lekta mind-dependent in a quite specific sense. Since Stoic impressions are physical entities, this dependence might be seen, in turn, as of a piece with the wider dependence of incorporeals on bodies. Scade's intricate view may thus rest in part on contested questions about the wider structure of Stoic metaphysics.

A. G. Long's "Subtexts, Connections and Open Opposition" applies to the question of early Stoic engagement with Plato's dialogues a distinction between direct criticism and indirect "subtextual" modes of response. Long illustrates this distinction by contrasting the various indirect allusions to Sparta in Plato's Republic Books 2-7 -- allusions amounting to "a subtextual dialectic with the Spartan precedent" (107) -- with Plato's more explicit criticisms of Sparta in Book 8. To what extent were Stoic responses to Plato similarly direct or indirect? In most cases, Long cautions against supposing that Stoic disagreement with Plato was openly expressed. An exception is Zeno's Republic: here Long argues that Zeno had good grounds for offering direct (as opposed to subtextual) criticisms of Plato. Zeno wanted to emphasize that political theorizing should begin from criticisms of existing institutions, as Zeno's own Republic is said to have done. This reconstruction of Zeno's method is as plausible as any, but Long's strong positive claims about Zeno's views fit somewhat uneasily with his cautionary approach to the evidence in the first half of the essay.

Seneca's Letters 58 and 65 have often been mined -- thanks to their discussions of Platonic ontology and causation -- as evidence for Stoic and middle Platonic views alike. The essay by George Boys-Stones, "Seneca against Plato: Letters 58 and 65," adds to several recent studies questioning the soundness of this approach.[5] Boys-Stones goes further, however, particularly in the case of Letter 58. The philosophical core of this letter is not simply a muddle (Brad Inwood's more forgiving judgment) but a "hopeless mess" of little value for reconstructing Stoic ontology or middle Platonic views (136-37). Boys-Stones reads it, instead, as a deliberate exemplification of a linguistic method of which Seneca elsewhere (e.g., Ep. 45.6) disapproves: Seneca introduces a Platonic classificatory scheme not to reconcile it with Stoic views but to illustrate (by example) a characteristically Platonic conflation of linguistic and ontological categories. Letter 65 has a similar anti-Platonic aim: its Phaedo-like structure (usefully mapped by Boys-Stones) sets up a critique of Platonic causation that is more narrowly polemical than commentators have recognized.

This interpretation rests on an attractively unified understanding of Seneca's letters as a whole: they form a propaedeutic progression intended to guide the reader away from "verbal distinctions" and "sophistical niceties" toward positive Stoic doctrine. But it also depends, in the case of Letter 58, on the supposition that Seneca himself deliberately engages in such niceties, blurring a distinction of which he is well aware to illustrate the dangers of blurring this distinction. Boys-Stones characterizes this method as "devious" but finds it plausible in view of Seneca's similar approach in other letters. I expect this conclusion will be weighed against alternatives that take Seneca to be less devious, including especially studies that see Letter 58 as a useful source of evidence for Stoic metaphysical views.

The final essay by Thomas Bénatouïl, "Theôria and Scholê in Epictetus and Marcus Aurelius" considers the "Platonist leanings" of Epictetus and Marcus Aurelius on the subjects of contemplation and the philosophical life (147). Bénatouïl's main conclusion -- that their views of these matters are essentially Stoic rather than Platonic -- does not overwhelm, but Bénatouïl provides, in addition, a rich discussion of the Platonic and Pythagorean background to the concepts of theôria and scholê. He especially traces the use made of these notions by Epictetus and Marcus to passages in the Theaetetus: to the detached perspective of the philosopher as elaborated at 173-75 and the ideal of homoiôsis theiô(i) at 176b1-2. This does not mean that Epictetus and Marcus are Platonizing, however: contemplation as they conceive it is not directed at "Forms but at the world, its causes, its structure and its evolution as laid down in Stoic physics" (157).

On the whole, this collection is weighted toward questions of influence and reception rather than philosophical reconstruction. There is philosophical reconstruction -- particularly in the essays by Bryan and Scade -- but the common aim is the clarification of Plato's influence on Stoicism and of the methodology appropriate to mapping that influence. Perhaps unavoidably, some of the volume's main conclusions are negative, focused on what the evidence "does not prevent us from supposing" (111). Regrettably, this is an area in which the evidence does not prevent us from supposing many things. This may limit the volume's appeal for readers with a taste for positive conclusions, but partly because of its attention to methodology, this book will be of use to those wishing to understand what can be known -- or conjectured -- about the reception of Plato by Stoics in the Hellenistic period and later antiquity.

[1] E.g., V. Harte, M.M. McCabe, R.W. Sharples and A. Sheppard (eds.), Aristotle and the Stoics Reading Plato (London, 2010); M. Bonazzi and C. Helmig (eds.), Platonic Stoicism, Stoic Platonism: The Dialogue between Platonism and Stoicism in Antiquity (Leuven, 2007); G. Reydams-Schils, Demiurge and Providence, Stoic and Platonist Readings of Plato's Timaeus (Turnhout, 1999).

[2] T. Bénautouïl, "Force, fermeté, froid: la dimension physique de la vertu stoïcienne," Philosophie antique 5 (2005), 5-30; J.-B. Gourinat, 'Les éclipses de la phronèsis dans le stoicism, de Cléanthe à Marc Aurèle,' in D. Lories and L. Rizzerio (eds.), Le jugement pratique (Paris, Vrin, 2008), 167-97.

[3] E.g., at Fin. 4.14.

[4] As Scade notes (83n11), Proclus says (problematically) that the Stoics think the limits of bodies "subsist in mere thought" (kat' epinoian psilên huphestanai), but Scade contrasts the limits of bodies with "mentally constructed" limits (Proclus In Eucl. El. I.89, 15-18=LS 50D).

[5] Especially following, in some respects, recent assessments by Brad Inwood: "Seneca, Plato and Platonism: the case of Letter 65," in Bonazzi and Helmig, 149-67; Seneca: Selected Philosophical Letters (Oxford, 2007), 107-55.