Plato and the Talmud

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Jacob Howland, Plato and the Talmud, Cambridge University Press, 2011, 282pp., $85.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780521193139.

Reviewed by Sol Goldberg, University of Toronto


Diverse readers should find in Jacob Howland's comparative study many appealing features, though its title is not among them. It implies misleadingly that two vast corpora which have no obvious relation to each other are to be discussed generally. Howland, however, wisely concentrates on just two Platonic dialogues -- the Apology and the Euthyphro -- and a selection of aggadic (narrative or non-legalistic) material from chapter three of tractate Ta'anit ("Ritual Fasts") in the Talmud. Their narrative details are analyzed with tremendous historical erudition, literary acuity, and philosophical enthusiasm. And the results of this exegetical work are not only some rather persuasive interpretations, but also some thought-provoking comparisons. Among the main analogies that Howland discovers are that rational inquiry and religious faith are equally essential to the speeches and deeds of both Socrates and the Talmudic sages; that both the Platonic dialogues and the Talmud combine dialectical argument with dramatic narratives featuring exemplary figures who mimetically convey truths about justice and piety that are to be lived as well as known; and that these texts, which simultaneously uphold and transform traditional, largely oral religious beliefs and practices, try to involve readers in their inquiries so that they become participants in a community whose members are bound to one another and to God or the gods in collaborative inquiry.

As compelling as these individual interpretations and comparisons are, however, that judgment does not yet amount to a positive assessment of the book overall. And that assessment, furthermore, requires a prior decision about the criterion which should be applied in establishing its merits. Is the right standard a book's own explicit purpose or ambition? Is it what a book actually offers? Or is it instead what a book might have undertaken? This review will assess Plato and the Talmud according to each of these three standards.

Howland regards as "a fair test of [his] interpretation … whether it helps … to disclose some new levels of meaning in the Platonic dialogues and the Talmud," considering it enough "if the present study stimulates readers to return to these texts with fresh questions, and prepares them to hear some previously unexpected answers" (p. 22). This test sounds rather modest, but not if viewed against the backdrop of a central claim of his book. Both the Platonic dialogues and the Talmud attempt, according to Howland, not only to draw readers into debates about fundamental moral and theological issues that do not have final resolutions and so always permit new perspectives, but also to educate readers for membership in a community of study by conveying the experience of a call to become an active member in this community. If Howland indeed discloses new levels of meaning in the texts he explains and thus stimulates a fresh return to them, then he will have not only satisfied his seemingly modest purpose but also practiced successfully what these texts preach. He is certainly an exemplary reader, modeling throughout an impressive combination of literary, historical, and philosophical sensitivity to the narrative details from which the arguments of the Apology, the Euthyphro, and Ta'anit 3 emerge. In chapter five ("Words and Deeds"), for instance, he examines five stories about different sages whose various attempts to exemplify a life of Torah are fundamentally incompatible. Taking the stories as a series, Howland claims that the sages' conflicting examples establish some basic oppositions (e.g., study vs. business; moderation vs. extremism; restraint vs. action) and thus open up a field of moral alternatives that prevent readers from being utterly impressionable and that require them to think for themselves. Like many of the book's individual claims, this one about the pedagogy of the Talmud is effectively demonstrated, in addition to having an obvious appeal for anyone interested in the philosophical merits of literary forms.

But the book, Howland's own criterion for assessing it notwithstanding, does not intend to be merely a spur to and training in actively reading the Platonic dialogues and the Talmud. His comparative study of select Platonic and Talmudic writings is, in fact, framed as a response to Leo Strauss' views about the radical incompatibility of Athens (philosophical rationality) and Jerusalem (Biblical faith) as intellectual orientations and, more importantly, as ways of life. His argument contra Strauss is meant to cast a different light on Socratic philosophizing, on the one hand, by situating Socrates' way of life against the background of the traditional Greek religious beliefs and practices he transforms, and on Talmudic faith, on the other hand, by showing that rabbis strive to extend human understanding by means of rational inquiry. It is this relationship between reason and faith common to both traditions that largely guides Howland's selection of the few texts from the two large corpora on which he draws, though certainly each deals with a plethora of other topics that he might have tackled instead.

At one level, of course, some such choice faces every comparative philosophical study; at another level, however, the choice can be made more or less explicitly into a methodological problem, the reflection on which can often lead to more nuanced and cautious conclusions. Howland reflects very little on the methodological question about the commensurability of Athens and Jerusalem. He asks whether Strauss' claims about the incommensurability of "Greek philosophy and the Bible leave[s] room for … a meaningful comparison between Plato and the Talmud" (p. 4), but this question itself obscures a concern about a methodological sort of incommensurability which Howland should, and Strauss need not, raise. One could perhaps maintain that Strauss should have been more critical in taking over Tertullian's question of what Athens has to do with Jerusalem. After all, unlike Tertullian, Strauss is concerned not with defending the essence of Christianity from philosophically influenced heresies but with defining quite generally the essence of philosophy in contrast to the essence of faith. But, precisely for this reason, he can ignore the methodological question about the grounds on which Athens and Jerusalem can be adequately compared, since they are together shorthand for a fundamental existential problem and only tangentially designate the actual literary works of the peoples identified with each of these two cities. The same cannot be said for Howland's concern with Athens and Jerusalem as two historically distinct textual traditions.

Howland could be right that Athens and Jerusalem, as concretized in the Platonic dialogues and the Talmud respectively, might each hold that rational inquiry begins with a revelation (i.e., God's words at Mount Sinai and the Delphic oracle's mysterious claim about Socrates) and that human wisdom must accept unsurpassable limits. But this agreement does not mean that each tradition understands by its sort of "faith" or "piety" anything like what the other tradition does. Incommensurability in the meanings of such fundamental terms differs from incommensurability between two ways of life which are incommensurable simply in the sense that a person could not live both with complete allegiance, not in the sense that they might be mutually unintelligible.

The possibility that Athens and Jerusalem are mutually unintelligible does not seem to be on Howland's radar (or on Strauss' either, for that matter). Howland, it must be noted, does observe profound differences between the two traditions. For example, he notes that there is no analogue in Socratic philosophizing to the miraculous intervention of God in human life described in the Bible and Talmud and that Plato cannot assume, as the Talmud generally can, a readership that already accepts its basic religious outlook. But he observes such differences between the two traditions within the context of his study's basic assumption that these differences occur against a common, perhaps even universal, backdrop. This assumption is nowhere even acknowledged, let alone substantiated. In view of this omission, the autonomous understanding and pious obedience that, according to Howland, both play roles in Socratic philosophizing and Talmudic inquiry might point to a superficial resemblance rather than a profound similarity.

The methodological shortcomings of Howland's comparative analysis raise questions not only about how he might have proceeded otherwise, but also about what other aim he might have pursued. Upon seeing the title of Howland's book, one cannot help but reflect on the Platonic dialogues' standard prominence in and the Talmud's typical absence from philosophical curricula in the present as well as the past. One reason for this difference is no doubt that philosophy is identified with Athens and that something other than philosophy -- be it faith or revelation -- with Jerusalem, whence it follows that neither the Bible nor the Talmud has any place in the philosophical curriculum because it simply is not philosophy. Howland's comparative analysis could help change this perception. It cannot, however, alter another perception that has historically kept the Talmud out of the philosophical curriculum, namely, the apparent parochialism of the Talmud. Indeed, Howland himself makes a similar charge. Whereas the theme of the relationship between faith and reason determines entirely which Platonic dialogues will be his focus, he selects Talmudic passages based not only on their relevance to this theme but also on whether they are likely to appeal to people other than religious Jews. He explains that,

while Talmudic debate on matters of halakha [Jewish law] is rich with philosophical implications, it is on the whole of limited interest to readers who are not observant Jews. Aggadah, however, has the kind of universal appeal and accessibility that characterizes both Hebrew Scriptures and the Platonic dialogues … [and are] the primary means by which the Talmud is able to draw readers of all faiths and backgrounds into reflection and debate on humanly fundamental issues (p. 17).

Howland might be right in this assessment that all of Plato's dialogues have universal appeal while large sections of the Talmud are of interest only to a particular group. But one could reply that, for this very reason, an approach is needed that would win the Talmud a wider audience, even universalize it -- though not by illicitly integrating it into a superficial universalism.

An alternative to comparative analysis seems to be the sort of translation that Emmanuel Levinas understands as a transition from Hebrew particularity to Greek universality and that he moreover derives from rabbinic tradition itself. Commenting on a passage from the Talmud in which an obligation of the Israelites to translate "very clearly" their experience into all the languages of the world is under discussion, Levinas writes: "We have not yet finished translating the Bible. The Septuagint is incomplete. Nor have we finished translating the Talmud. We have hardly begun. And as far as the Talmud is concerned, it must be said how delicate the task is!"[1] The task's delicacy, Levinas implies, lies in the all too hasty manner in which Talmudic thought might pass into foreign languages without being liberated from its unusual form, on the one hand, and without expressing its particular content on the other. So, even though it might make its way into other languages, the Talmud would not yet be translated in either of these two events since translation means, according to the Talmudic passage cited by Levinas, the enrichment of foreign idioms.

Can the Talmud, as Levinas hopes, enrich universal philosophical idioms? Readers will not find clear instances of this sort of enrichment in Howland's limited comparison of a few select aggadot with a couple of Platonic dialogues. But they will find in his charming book not only interesting and informative analyses of these texts, but also an example of what one ought to do in tackling these texts oneself.

[1] Emmanuel Levinas, Beyond the Verse: Talmudic Readings and Lectures (Bloomington, Indiana: Indiana University Press, 1994), 75.