Plato as a Critical Theorist

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Jonny Thakkar, Plato as a Critical Theorist, Harvard University Press, 2018, 373pp., $39.95 (hbk), ISBN 9780674971769.

Reviewed by Federico Zuolo, University of Genoa


Is there anything new to be said about Plato's Republic? Is it possible to distill some original and timely contribution from a work that has had such a profound influence on Western philosophy since its very inception? In this light, any new study of Plato's Republic will seem like an audacious and daunting enterprise. The greatest merit of Thakkar's book is that it proposes an interpretation of Plato's Republic that is original in both exegetical and theoretical terms. Indeed, Thakkar aims to provide contemporary thought, and in particular -- although not only -- contemporary political theory, with a whole Platonic perspective on the role of ideals, on what we can demand of citizens and of public philosophy.

In brief, such a book is commendable for a number of reasons: its audacity, its somewhat grandiose scope, its being an excellent example of a classical way of doing philosophy, in which great classical figures provide a model for contemporary theorizing, and its capacity to address the sometimes technical and fine-grained debates in the relevant fields (classics and political theory) while still engaging the non-specialist reader by posing and answering fundamental political and philosophical questions, such as those pertaining to the role of philosophy, the link between government and knowledge, the function of ideals, and the idea of critical theory.

The book has two parts. The first provides a comprehensive reconstruction of the Republic and, therefore, is an internal exegesis. The second part brings the proposed reinterpretation to bear on three contemporary problems: the notion of historical possibility and the role of normative ideals; the idea of philosophizing as a role of reflective citizenship; and the possibility of criticizing the malfunctioning of contemporary capitalism.

The first chapter is devoted to reconstructing what constitutes philosophy in Plato's view. This entails analyzing the well-known theory of Forms. Thakkar interprets Forms as another aspect of reality, not as another reality; that is, he views them as principles of unity and normative functions of things. This reconciles the prominent philosophers' competence (knowledge of Forms) with the claim that they should rule the city. The second chapter clarifies the activity of philosophers as rulers, namely as guardians of the city and of the citizens' souls. The third chapter sets out a detailed reconstruction of how in practice philosophers could rule the just city. According to Thakkar, they would do so by creating many ideals and beautiful paradeigmata that could provide guidelines -- both as concrete fashioning of the city and imaginary patterns -- for peoples' lives. This activity is further explained in chapter four, where Thakkar puts the philosophers in nonideal cities and shows how they could use myths to orient the citizens' characters.

The second part commences with chapter five. Here Thakkar outlines an idea of possibility that makes sense of the ideals' practicality, and distinguishes them from impossible utopias. In chapter six, Thakkar outlines the ideal of philosopher-citizens as people engaged in the activity of shaping characters around an idea of the good life. Thakkar argues that, despite Plato's paternalism and elitism, such activity may be compatible with our liberal societies. In chapter seven, Thakkar uses Plato's critique of moneymaking and reinterprets it in the light of Marx's account of capitalism. The idea of critical theory here is fully outlined as an activity of criticizing the structural manner in which capitalism is a malfunctioning system, in which the original aim of activities is put into the service of capital accumulation.

Now I would like to summarize the merits of Thakkar's book. The most important contribution is to be found in its staunch and careful defense of the role of ideals and of ideal theory. The originality of Thakkar's contribution is the vindication of ideals and ideal theory as necessary components of a renewed critical theory. This is notable because Marxian and post-structuralist versions of critical theory have often dismissed ideals and normative theorizing as a form of ideology in disguise. In contrast, Thakkar brings Plato and Marx together, so to speak, with a view to making ideal theory work in concrete social settings, and producing social critique in the light of ideals. Thakkar also chooses the appropriate object of analysis: indeed, he focuses on a Platonic view, namely a "way of thinking about the world" (p. 32). In this way Plato is brought into dialogue with Rawls and Marx without reducing them to mere simplified figures or actualizing their thought in the wrong way. On this issue, and turning specifically to Plato's interpretation, Thakkar does aim to actualize Plato, since he wants to demonstrate how a Platonic view may make sense in our societies despite the enormous differences between contexts and value commitments. That said, Thakkar does not credit Plato with being a liberal or a democrat, of course. The originality of his interpretation lies in the fact that he seeks to reveal Plato's possible contribution to our social thinking without hiding the sometimes disturbing political dimensions of the Republic. Indeed, after Popper's attack on Plato qua father of totalitarian thought, the tendency of many recent interpretations has been either to minimize the difference between the normative content of the Republic and liberal democracies, or to downplay the Republic's political import by arguing that the Republic is actually about ethics rather than politics (see Julia Annas and Gadamer), or by suggesting that Plato's intention was rather ironic, and that he actually meant quite the opposite of what appears in the text (Leo Strauss).[1]

Despite its merits, the book does contain some unconvincing theses. First, I will discuss the problems in the Platonic exegesis, before pointing out what seem to me to be some theoretical weaknesses. The following critical remarks, though, should be read as expressing some doubts from a person who shares much of the book's methodological commitments and contents.

The first problem is Thakkar's interpretation of the theory of Forms. Although this is the most contentious issue in Platonic philosophy, which has been interpreted in a number of ways, it is necessary to say something about why Thakkar's interpretation seems unconvincing. He aims to demonstrate that philosophy is necessary for ruling, despite its appearance to the contrary. This controversial point is obviously present in Plato's mind too, as signaled in his warning that the audience might ridicule the very idea of philosopher-kings. Thakkar attempts to tackle the issue from the outset: How can philosophy be capable of ruling, if the traditional way of understanding the Platonic philosophy has more to do with abstract issues that do not pertain to this world? Thakkar claims that this is an incorrect interpretation of the Platonic theory of Forms, which should not be understood as entities existing in a separate world. Rather, they should be understood as another aspect of this reality, the aspect relating to the unity of things in their varying appearances and their good: "to know the form of an object is to know what it is best for it to be" (p. 59). Since Forms are just another aspect of this reality, knowing is a holistic reasoning:

to work out the form of any one object, we also need to work out the forms of other objects in the same functional context. Nor does the holistic reasoning stop there, for the function context itself will be a part of a wider whole, such that its optimal condition can be assessed only in the light of the optimal form of its neighbors. This chain will finish only when we arrive at the ultimate functional context, namely the cosmos, which is the systematic interconnected whole of forms and final causes. (p. 59)

This implies that the Form of goodness is not an entity, but rather "a certain [harmonious] constitution of forms" (p. 66).

Discussing the problems (and merits) of this interpretation would take too much space. For our current purposes, suffice it to say the following. First, this view seems to be in tension with other instances of discussion of the theory of Forms (in particular, Phaedo and Symposium) where Plato does seem to outline the idea that the Forms are entities existing in another dimension.[2] This, of course, has problems of its own and cannot be taken as the Platonic final word. Moreover, Thakkar is committed to discussing the dialogue as a unity in itself. Hence, references to other dialogues should not be made in order to refute his interpretation. But in other places he refers to passages of other dialogues that chime with his interpretation. Hence, this critical remark is valid. Second, Thakkar supports his "mundane" understanding of the theory of Forms as a correct interpretation of the text and as a way of making sense of the practical capacity of the philosopher rulers. This latter point is correct. However, in some passages Plato does affirm that philosophers will not only know the Forms, but also be experts of practical things as much as other rulers (484d). If the aim of the whole theory of Forms were that of vindicating the philosopher's practical knowledge, why would it be necessary to emphasize that they have practical capacities? Third, if Plato really wanted to flesh out the idea that philosophers have knowledge of this world and not of something else, he could have pursued thoroughly and not sporadically in the Republic the idea that the ruler should be a sort of technician or craftsman, whereas he uses this conceptual strategy more in other dialogues (Gorgias, Statesman, and Euthydemus). Indeed, in the Republic Plato also uses the analogy between knowledge and techne (for instance, in the metaphors of the pilot of a ship and the doctor). But in the Republic philosophy is certainly more than the other techniques.

The second unconvincing feature of Thakkar's interpretation concerns its political dimension. The activity of philosophers, both in the Kallipolis and in nonideal societies, would be to construct and bring about ideals. In the Kallipolis the philosophers would have the power to do this by holding the other members of the city to account for their work and by reflecting on the contribution that each part should give to the whole. This interpretation is certainly correct. The problem is that it somewhat neglects the power dimension of ruling as a necessary component of both the ideal and nonideal societies (Thakkar prefers the term "society" rather than "city", or "state" for polis.) Indeed, Thakkar scarcely discusses the big problem of political initiative in the Republic: how can a society -- that is mostly corrupted -- accept the rule of philosophers who are, by definition, uncorrupt and alien to the current social logic? Plato was well aware of this problem and for this reason he provided diverse alternatives. For instance, either the king could become a philosopher, or the philosophers could become kings (Republic 473), or a group of philosophers could find an ally in a tyrant (Laws 709-710).

The first is the route that Plato himself tried in his travels to Syracuse. The second is admitted as a possibility, without finding it probable at all (Republic 499-500). After all, how could people who are used to demagogues and sophists accept philosophical rule? The third is a variant of the first, and the fact that it has been repeated and discussed in the Laws is probably a clue that for Plato it could have been the most accessible. In sum, putting ruling and philosophy together is a necessary and yet difficult task, which also entails the use of force. Thakkar, instead, wants to characterize the ruling capacity of philosophers even without their holding office. If this may be acceptable regarding the Kallipolis, which once established could be ruled without force, it is less convincing in respect of nonideal conditions, namely when the Kallipolis is not established and real philosophers are trapped in nonideal circumstances (chap. 4). Thakkar rightly holds that ruling means directing souls, which does not per se require having an office (and force). Hence, philosophers could rule in nonideal societies by "exercising influence over the social imaginary" (p. 172). In general, we can say that it is true that Plato aimed at exerting influence over a restricted set of listeners and a wider audience. However, Plato's skepticism about the possibility of re-educating the people by simply convincing them through rational arguments and/or persuasive images and tales is well known. By contrast, Thakkar seems to propose a sort of ante litteram Gramscian strategy, namely the idea of conquering the corrupt society by way of controlling cultural production. Of course, Plato wanted to exert this cultural hegemony, but he was certainly pessimistic about its possibility, and this is why he thought that the recourse to force (kings and tyrants) was a realistic necessity for philosophers to rule.

Let us now discuss the less convincing aspects of Thakkar's conceptual contribution. At a conceptual level, his analysis of the different senses of possibility (chap. 5) is brilliant. But perhaps there is something missing, as becomes apparent in the further distinction he makes between ideals and utopia. He says that both "are imaginary entities, but whereas ideals are constrained by possibility, utopias are not" (p. 211). However, this distinction is sketched at the meta-theoretical level, without an account of what is historically possible. Of course, providing a defensible account of what is historically possible exceeds the scope of this book. But leaving this distinction without further clarification makes the attribution of the utopian or idealistic character dependent upon the possibly whimsical attitude of the reader or theorist. A bit of uncertainty around the idea of utopia can also be seen when Thakkar briefly discusses the so-called "first city" constructed in the dialogue where all citizens perform a specific role and all basic goods are provided. This functional city complies with a minimal understanding of the principle of justice (everybody accomplishes her own function) and is therefore healthy. But this city is only seemingly perfect because, as Glaucon claims, it is a city for pigs (that is to say, it is too simplistic and rough to be acceptable). How can we define this city as a utopia? It is an imaginary city, constructed by following a unique principle. We can suppose it is not possible in reality, but it is hardly appealing. Can we define something as a utopia only because it is imagined in thought, impossible, and only apparently desirable? This seems counterintuitive. We should rather define the city of pigs as a dystopia or as an imperfect model.

I would like to conclude with a few remarks on a more general feature of Thakkar's argument that remains somewhat unconvincing. Although he (rightly) insists on the conceptual and practical need for ideals and ideal theory, the upshot of his long detour is, in some respects, less radical than one might have expected. Indeed, the role of ideals in Plato is first and foremost that of providing a blueprint for a radical political initiative that could reconstruct the polis from its beginning. Instead, Thakkar ends up proposing a sort of critical theory that appeals to ideals but is also present in the daily life of potentially any citizen. Each person ought to make sense of how to pursue the good life despite the threats posed by the corrupting capitalist system. Hence, each person ought to find a way of resisting the totalizing logic of capital accumulation, while discovering concrete and symbolic ways to show why this logic is wrong and how people can live differently. This picture is both more pessimistic and more optimistic than either Plato or Marx would have envisioned. It is more pessimistic because it renounces any possible radical change of the economic system through revolution; but it is more optimistic insofar as it moves the burden of responsibility onto the shoulders of individuals. How can we suppose that people, who are trapped under the manipulating force of ideology, might also be capable of overturning the whole dominant system thanks to the force of critique? This dilemma is well known in all critical theories, and, of course, it is not exclusive to Thakkar's proposal. However, my final worry is that this picture -- whatever its realism or optimism -- seems to be lacking a properly institutional perspective, because most of the initiative is foisted onto individual citizens. If we combine this with Thakkar's attempt to reconcile Plato's critical theory with a democratic and liberal setting, then what emerges is a more moderate and less radical form of critical theory. Supporters of liberal democracy (myself included) cannot but welcome this reconciliation. A further question would be to ask what more radical critical theorists would make of this conclusion.

[1] On the overall reconstruction of these interpretations see Mario Vegetti, "Un paradigma in cielo". Platone politico da Aristotele al Novecento (Roma: Carocci, 2009).

[2] A defense of the standard interpretation of the Platonic theory of Forms in the middle dialogues, also known as the Two-Worlds-Theory, can be found in Franco Ferrari, "Philosophical Knowledge and Political Beliefs in Plato's Republic 5", in M. Vegetti, F. Ferrari, & T. Lynch, The Painter of Constitutions: Selected Essays on Plato's Republic (Sankt Augustin: Academia Verlag, 2013), pp. 123-136.