Plato: Laws 10

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Robert Mayhew, Plato: Laws 10, Oxford University Press, 2008, 238pp., $70.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199225965.

Reviewed by Nathan Powers, The University at Albany (SUNY)


Even to its admirers, the Laws is a turgid and uneven work; Plato's second attempt, late in life, to describe an ideal government lacks much of the philosophical verve of his earlier Republic. But Book 10 of the dialogue is an exception. Here Plato undertakes to refute certain impious views that he believes to be obstructive to the preservation of good government. In the course of doing so, he offers the earliest surviving arguments both for the existence of a god (or gods) and for the providential divine administration of the universe. Laws 10 is thus a key document for understanding the early development of philosophical theology. Indeed, since in making his case Plato appeals primarily to facts about the physical world that are in principle observable by anyone, Laws 10 arguably stands at the head of the entire tradition of "natural" theology in the West. Viewed from this angle, Laws 10 has suffered from strange neglect at the hands of modern scholars. This is the situation Robert Mayhew seeks to remedy in his new book, the latest entry in Oxford's Clarendon Plato Series. The volume contains, in addition to a fresh translation of the text, the first extensive commentary on it to appear (in English) in well over a century. Mayhew approaches this task with a great deal of patience and good judgment. Despite the caveats that I shall express below, this is a book that anyone seriously interested in Plato's Laws will want to consult.

It seems appropriate to begin with a few words about the translation, which aims to stay extremely close to the original Greek. In particular, Mayhew tries to render important recurring Greek terms with the same English words wherever they appear. This approach produces mixed results. While it does usefully make the reader aware of where Plato is using the same language in multiple spots, it can also have the effect of obscuring information about the connotations of the words involved which a more flexible, context-sensitive approach to translation might preserve. To take an example, Mayhew translates the Greek word epimeleia (and its cognates) as "supervision" (and its cognates) throughout. This is an important term because it is the word Plato settles on, after having argued for the existence of gods, to characterize their relationship to human beings: the gods exercise epimeleia towards humans. Now, in Greek this word is used to convey the stewardship that good owners show towards their possessions, or that good administrators exhibit in their areas of responsibility. Good owners are concerned to bring their possessions into a good condition and to preserve them in that condition; good householders will bring domestic affairs into good order and keep them that way. Such, Plato claims, is the attitude of the gods towards humans. "Supervision" has, I think, a rather thinner meaning; it lacks epimeleia's connotation of concerned attention. Trevor Saunders, in his 1970 translation, does a better job by translating the word variously (where the context suggests it) as the gods' "supervision" or "control" over, "diligence" or "concern" towards, being "solicitous" or "attentive" to, or showing "care" for human affairs. In general, Saunders' translation is more fluid than Mayhew's, without being significantly less accurate.

However, most readers won't be interested in this book primarily for Mayhew's translation, but for his substantial commentary on the text. Generally speaking, the comments are cautious in tone; Mayhew tends to set out the various interpretive possibilities that one might opt for rather than pursuing a strong line of interpretation himself, either at the level of individual passages or over the course of the whole text. This may be the book's chief strength, and at the same time its chief weakness. Readers looking for a thoughtful companion for a walk through the text, or for help with understanding better a particular passage, will for the most part be in luck. Those who are looking for a strong take on how the positions staked out in Laws 10 fit into the dense constellation of views that Plato develops in his late dialogues, or even on what the implications of the theology of Book 10 are for the political theory of the Laws, will be less satisfied.

This quality of the commentary is usefully illustrated by Mayhew's remarks on the opening passage of Book 10. Here he persuasively settles some difficult points, but at the same time misses an interesting opportunity. In the passage Plato states the need for a special law against impiety. (The law itself is formulated and discussed only briefly at the end of Book 10; most of the intervening space is occupied with a formal rhetorical "prelude" to the law addressing the root causes of impious actions -- namely, incorrect beliefs about the gods.) Mayhew does an excellent job of illuminating the connections (which Plato leaves surprisingly unclear) between this opening passage and the immediately preceding material in Book 9, which deals with the law on violent crimes against persons. I think he is right in claiming that Plato views impiety primarily as a kind of violent crime against property -- in the first instance, the sacred property of the gods; but certain other especially serious crimes (for example, against the property of parents or magistrates) also count as impiety. What Mayhew does not discuss, here or elsewhere, is how the theism Plato argues for in Book 10 as the cure for impiety is more generally related to the rule of law as conceived throughout the Laws. At a number of points throughout the dialogue Plato emphasizes that belief in the gods is essential to the establishment of a good law code and to the ongoing administration of justice. And in Laws 10, the character Kleinias draws attention precisely to the political significance of the subject: a successful defense of theism would be, he says, the "finest and best prelude on behalf of all the laws" (887b, my emphasis). There is, then, an interesting question (whose answer is far from clear) as to how exactly correct theological beliefs are supposed to be foundational to just government as envisioned in the Laws. An exploration of this question would have been a welcome addition to the volume.

Where Mayhew succeeds most is in his discussion of some of Book 10's thorniest passages. For example, having argued that all motion in the physical world ultimately derives from soul, Plato goes on to infer that the soul or souls responsible for the world's most important, large-scale motions (those of the celestial bodies) are rational. We might expect at this point some version of the argument from design; but the ground Plato offers for the inference is, curiously, that the motion of these bodies "has the same nature as the motion and revolution and calculations of reason, and proceeds in a related way" (897c). He goes on to offer (897d-898c) a comparison between the motions of the celestial bodies and the "motion of reason," claiming to find a number of similarities. The gist of this vexing passage is that in their unerring circularity and completely steady pace, celestial motions somehow resemble the uniformity, constancy, and regularity of rational thought. Mayhew lays out a number of plausible new suggestions about how exactly the comparison is to be understood.

Mayhew's patient analysis pays off in his remarks on another notoriously difficult passage, Laws 903a-905d. Here, after arguing for the thesis that the gods must care about individual human beings (that is, that they must reward virtue and punish vice among humans, despite apparent counterexamples), Plato offers a myth about divine justice that seems intended to provide a persuasive background picture for this thesis. Roughly, the picture is this: after death, human souls are relocated to destinations befitting the character they have acquired during the course of their lives. Plato also attempts to sketch, in an extremely murky fashion, how the gods have arranged the physical world in such a way that this transposition of souls is an easy task for them to perform. In other words, the basic physical rules or constraints the cosmos follows were -- somehow -- designed from the outset with the administration of divine justice (as described in this myth) in mind. Mayhew picks his way through the thicket of philological and philosophical issues here with great clarity, offering what may be the best overall discussion of this passage to date.

I will register one particular point of disagreement I have with Mayhew. He claims that Plato commits a logical fallacy in a key part of the argument for god's existence. It will help first to summarize the chief points of Plato's argument: (a) all motion or change is ultimately due to one or more self-moving entities; so (b) these self-movers, as the originators of all motion and change, are "prior" to entities which are merely moved by other things. Now, (c) self-movers must be alive (that is, they must be ensouled things), because when we say something is alive we mean precisely that it has the power to cause motion or change in itself. That power is the soul. So (d) the first principles of the physical cosmos are souls, in virtue of which self-moving entities move themselves; souls are prior to all bodily, physical entities. From this point, Plato goes on to argue that (e) among these self-moving first principles of the cosmos are gods: these will be souls that are guided in their motion by reason (nous). In arguing for (e), Plato asserts not just the priority of soul over inanimate bodily nature, but more specifically the priority of reason (and other particular aspects of soul) over body. He makes this claim most expansively at 896d: "Habits, moral characteristics, wishes, calculations, true opinions, supervision, and memory would have come into being prior to length of bodies, width, depth, and strength, if soul is prior to body."

Mayhew suggests that in making this last claim, Plato commits the fallacy of division. He takes Plato to be reasoning as follows (p. 130):

(1) Soul is older than or prior to body.

(2) Therefore, every part or aspect or manifestation of soul is older than or prior to every part or aspect or manifestation of body.

But (2) does not follow logically from (1). Mayhew believes this is no "trivial logical slip" (p. 131); for unless fixed, he claims, it undercuts Plato's core line of argument.

Now, I'm not completely convinced that Plato is committing the fallacy Mayhew attributes to him. Plato may have some reason to consider (2), or something like it, to be implicit in (1), given his (normal Greek) conception of soul as what's explanatory of life, and given that he (peculiarly) treats all cases of self-motion as forms of life. Given these views, he may well feel the need to emphasize, by asserting (2), that what ultimately explains every physical change or motion will be, in every case, some property or aspect of soul, and not any material property of bodies; soul does indeed have that kind of global and comprehensive priority to body on his account. It seems to me that the chief weakness in Plato's argument lies not in the inference from (1) to (2), but rather in (c), with the identification of self-motion and life. These suggestions would need to be fleshed out, of course. But the point I want to make is that even if the fallacy is indeed there, it is not nearly as damaging to Plato's overall argument as Mayhew makes it out to be.

Mayhew points out, correctly, that in arguing for (1), the most Plato can hope to have shown is that at least one self-mover (and so, one soul) existed prior to the formation of physical bodies; as to whether such a pre-cosmic being possessed (or could have possessed) faculties such as reason or memory, or moral characteristics, no conclusion follows. Plato "has given us no reason to think that these could not and did not come to be only alongside or after the appearance of certain physical entities -- i.e. animals and especially humans" (p. 130). Mayhew is worried because Plato has given us no grounds for inferring, from the observed properties and abilities of embodied souls, the properties and abilities of souls that existed antecedently to the formation of the physical cosmos. But absent such grounds, Mayhew thinks, Plato cannot show that these pre-cosmic souls are rational and hence divine.

I think that this worry betrays a mistaken (but widely shared) assumption about Plato's overall argumentative strategy for showing that the gods exist: to wit, the assumption that Plato's argument is meant to prove the existence of any and all gods that exist. In fact, in Laws 10 Plato is uninterested in establishing conclusions about the existence or character of unembodied gods (let alone pre-cosmic gods). His brief is to establish that there exist gods who govern human affairs, and to this end the gods he decides to talk about are the souls that move the celestial bodies. The reason he wants to talk about these particular gods is precisely that they can be observed -- or more precisely, their orderly, circular motions can be observed. The character of these motions, Plato thinks, offers positive grounds (as noted above) for the inference that the souls causing them are reasoning beings; this is the inference he relies on to establish the existence of gods. So there should be no worry that Plato simply assumes that certain mysterious, unobservable souls could be rational in a way at least somewhat similar to human rationality. What Plato needs to show in order to combat impiety is simply that there exist some gods who care about humans; and to show this, he confines himself to discussing the case of the celestial gods, the souls associated with the celestial bodies. About these souls we can make claims (Plato thinks) on the same sort of basis on which we make claims about the souls of our colleagues, neighbors, and pets: by observing what they do. (We may, of course, presume that Plato thinks that other sorts of gods exist; if so, they too will no doubt be rational, though their metaphysical character and relationship to the physical cosmos will be different from that of the celestial gods. But the argument of Laws 10 is silent on these matters.)

Although I have indicated what seem to me to be some shortcomings of this volume, I'd like to end by emphasizing that it is on the whole a clear, useful, and judicious examination of a too-long neglected text. I have no doubt that it will both stimulate new interest in Laws 10 and provide a sturdy foundation for further study of it.