Plato, Metaphysics and the Forms

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Francis A. Grabowski III, Plato, Metaphysics and the Forms, Continuum, 2008, 163pp., $130.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780826497802.

Reviewed by Andrew Mason, University of Edinburgh


In this volume, part of the series Continuum Studies in Ancient Philosophy, Francis A. Grabowski III defends a startling claim: that Plato's Forms should be seen as concrete particulars. Grabowski emphasises in the concluding section (p. 107) that this claim should be understood absolutely literally; 'the Bed itself is an eminently tangible bed; if it were kicked, it would be found solid and would give a resounding bang. Of course, though, it cannot really be kicked, at least not by ordinary folks with ordinary feet; our unreal, phantom feet would simply pass right through it.' While Grabowski excludes the later dialogues from consideration, it is notable that he does count the Euthyphro and Meno, as well as the classic 'middle period' dialogues, as providing evidence for his view.

Grabowski's argument falls into three parts. In the first chapter, he surveys Plato's language about the Forms, finding some things which suggest universals, others which suggest particulars, and concluding that it is impossible to make a definite judgement about the nature of Forms on the basis of this evidence. He then turns his attention to Plato's epistemology, in the hope that this will provide a clue to the nature of the Forms. In the second chapter he surveys the view of knowledge taken by the ancient Greeks in general, and philosophers in particular, and concludes that they generally conceived of knowledge as acquaintance, rather than as propositional, and assimilated it to perception. In the third and final chapter, returning to Plato, he argues that Plato, likewise, saw knowledge of Forms as perception. But, Grabowski infers, as only particulars can be objects of perception, it follows that Forms must be particulars.

It should be emphasised that Grabowski rests his entire case on this argument. While he believes that other aspects of Plato's language in connection with Forms also support his view, he accepts that they are not conclusive. But the argument is unlikely to produce conviction.

In the first place, it is possible to speak of perceiving universals; for instance, as Grabowski recognises (pp. 106-7), Bertrand Russell used the language of acquaintance in connection with universals. He dismisses this on the grounds that Russell speaks of our becoming acquainted with universals by a process of abstraction, but if acquaintance is, as Russell claims, a form of direct, non-derivative knowledge, it cannot be acquired by a process. But first, even if Russell's view does not make sense, the fact that he held it is sufficient evidence that it can be held; hence, it is not so obviously false that we can assume without further ado that Plato did not believe it. Second, while 'direct, non-derivative knowledge' can indeed not be achieved through a process of inference, it hardly follows that it cannot be achieved through a process at all; there may be a process of learning to perceive, as indeed there is with some kinds of literal perception. In any case, it seems clear that Plato sometimes thought of knowledge as achieved through a process: in the Meno (98a), a process of working out the explanation; in the Republic (511b-c, in explicit connection with Forms), a dialectical process which seeks for an unhypothetical starting-point.

Moreover, we can reasonably ask what Plato meant by using the language of perception. 'Seeing' and 'grasping' are well-known metaphors for knowing and understanding; Grabowski dismisses the possibility that Plato was using them in this way by claiming (p. 98) that 'sometimes, and no doubt very often, philosophers mean precisely what they say'; but when a very common metaphor is in play this cannot be assumed. (The case which he uses as a comparison, Thales' use of 'god', is not really parallel, as 'god' does not have a similar well-established metaphorical use.)

On the other hand, it may well be that Plato means more by his perceptual language than simply knowing or understanding; for instance, he may be using these terms to stand for a direct, non-inferential awareness. But this need not be closely analogous to perceiving a concrete object; we can speak of perceiving that something is the case (e.g. I might see that there are six people in a room), and by extension from this we could speak of perceiving the natures of unity, goodness, beauty and so on, in the sense of having a direct grasp of what these things are. Hence, knowledge of Forms might be perceptual in the sense of being direct, not based on inference or testimony, and yet be concerned with universals. Indeed, Aristotle, as Grabowski notes (pp. 98-9), uses the language of touch to denote the mind's direct awareness of its objects; but we can hardly argue that he did not believe in universals; it was he who explicitly introduced them into the debate.

Such knowledge might also be propositional, in the sense that it is knowledge that so-and-so is the case. Plato would not, of course, describe this knowledge as propositional, as he does not have the apparatus of propositions; but he clearly thinks of it, in some contexts at least, as parallel with true belief and as the sort of thing which can be expressed in a logos; in these contexts it cannot be exactly like perception of a particular.

Grabowski believes that the standard interpretation, according to which Forms are universals, arises from a tendency to see Plato's work too much in the light of modern philosophy, leading to the assumption that he is addressing a modern problem, the problem of attribute agreement. However, it may be that Grabowski himself is seeing Plato too much within the context of modern philosophy. He assumes that Forms are rightly understood in terms of the modern universal/particular distinction, and that if they are not universals as they are now commonly understood, they must be particulars. He does not recognise any third possibility. This is most acutely revealed by the way (pp. 115-6 n. 4) in which he dismisses the idea of Forms as universalia ante rem, which he ascribes only to mediaeval philosophers, and suggests may in fact be equivalent to the claim that they are concrete particulars. In discussing modern interpretations he assumes that concrete particulars and abstract universals are the only possibilities, so that if Forms are universals they must be immanent. But of course, Plato's Forms are widely understood as universals which are separable, in the sense that they do not depend on their instances for their existence. A similar view has been held not only in mediaeval but in modern times, notably by Russell and G. E. Moore. (Once again it is not to the point whether such a view makes sense, only that it can be held.)

Grabowski also assumes that Forms cannot be seen as having features both of universals and of particulars. Noting that Russell and Gregory Vlastos accuse Plato of this error, he says (p. 42) that Plato 'was certainly a sensible fellow, and no one as sensible as Plato would have believed in the absurd entities Russell and Vlastos take the Forms to be… . it seems unlikely that he could have been guilty of thinking that a universal was a particular.' Of course Plato did not think that a universal was a particular, because he did not have the concepts 'universal' and 'particular'. But if Plato was the first person to think deeply about this subject, it is by no means implausible that he might have posited entities which effectively play the role of universals, but are in some respects too like particulars. On the other hand it is also possible -- and this is a possibility which both sides of the present debate neglect -- that he actually held a coherent theory which cannot be fully described in terms of the universal/particular dichotomy, and posited entities which are like universals in some respects, like particulars in others. A possible theory along these lines might be one in which Forms are abstract patterns, related to particulars in something like the way a design is like a house built to that design. On such a view, Forms can be seen as independent of particulars, and as playing the role of paradigm, so that particulars can resemble them and in some cases fall short of them; yet they are abstract, and need not be seen as perfect examples of the qualities they represent.

While Grabowski is anxious to present Plato as a sensible fellow, and protect him against accusations of absurd views, his own position threatens to saddle Plato with equal absurdities. The problem is not that he posits non-physical particulars; Grabowski considers this objection, and points out, rightly, that many theories have posited such entities, Aristotle's God being a notable example. Rather, the problem is that on this view Plato posits specific kinds of particulars whose descriptions seems on the face of it, incoherent. These include particulars belonging to physical kinds, which do not occupy space; particulars belonging to kinds for which change is essential, which are nevertheless unchanging; and exemplars of properties such as largeness, which, one might think, cannot belong to a particular in an unqualified way. There may be some answers to these puzzles, but Grabowski gives no suggestion as to how they might be addressed.

There are undoubtedly problems, which Grabowski is right to highlight, with the view that Forms are simply universals as they are now commonly conceived; but the opposite view looks equally problematic. It seems more likely, either that Plato is confused, or that his theory is of a third kind which does not fit neatly into modern categories.

There are some things in this book which should be commended. For instance, I agree with Grabowski's argument against the view that Plato had a 'justified true belief' account of knowledge. And he is surely right to protest against tendentious translations of phrases like auto to ison as 'absolute equality' or 'equality in the abstract' (though his own translation, as 'The Equal Thing Itself' might also be considered tendentious, as there is no word in the Greek which translates as 'thing'.) However, as a whole the argument of the book is unconvincing.