Plato on the Limits of Human Life

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Sara Brill, Plato on the Limits of Human Life, Indiana University Press, 2013, 260pp., $30.00 (pbk), ISBN 9780253008879.

Reviewed by Alex Long, University of St Andrews


In Plato's Apology Socrates says that he has been urging the people he meets to direct their attention to 'making their soul as good as possible' (29d-e). From what he says there, it looks as if nobody said in reply that it is impossible to change or improve the soul. The retort sometimes put to him was quite different: these other people were already trying to improve, or take care of, their souls, and so did not need any encouragement or assistance from Socrates (29e). Even Socrates' prosecutors share his conviction that it is possible to change the soul, although that is not the wording they use. What concerns them, in addition to Socrates' unorthodox religiosity, is the thought that Socrates is making young people -- or, as Socrates would say, the souls of young people -- worse. When in the Republic Socrates considers how best to educate the young, he describes mothers and nurses 'moulding (plattein) souls with stories far more than they mould bodies with their hands' (377c). Here again there is no need to demonstrate that souls can be changed. But it is strange to speak of souls being 'moulded', and the comparison with 'moulding bodies' shows Plato's awareness that he is applying to the soul a verb that more properly describes physical processes. Similarly in the Laws the good legislator is said to 'mould' souls, but this comes after a figurative description of souls being heated and softened, and thus prepared for 'moulding', at symposia (671b-c).

These passages from the Republic and Laws lie behind much of Sara Brill's book on Platonic psychology and politics. The book has far less to say about birth and death than the title and cover (a photograph of a waterlogged grave) promise. The central objects of study are rather Plato's conception of the soul and the connections between Platonic politics and Platonic psychology. Brill very often attributes to Plato the view that the soul is 'plastic' or 'malleable'. As far as I can tell, the textual support for these adjectives is the discussion of education in Republic II: in Brill's translation of Republic 377a-c plattetai, 'is moulded', is rendered 'is plastic' (p.99). Three dialogues are discussed in detail: the Phaedo, the Republic and the Laws. Close attention to psychology and politics in the Laws is particularly welcome, although it is hardly fair to recent scholarship to say that the Laws 'is often treated as Plato's illegitimate child -- awkward, crude, embarrassing' (p. 165). Brill has better knowledge of the scholarship than this judgement suggests.

Brill promises that her study of the Phaedo will show 'the soul's plasticity' and will thus show how difficult it is to investigate the soul (p. 17). At this early stage in the book readers need to be told what 'plasticity' means here and what it will mean throughout the book. In the passage quoted above from Republic II Socrates has in mind the fact that souls can be educated (and can be educated well or badly). But in the three chapters on the Phaedo Brill discusses not education but a diffuse set of problems in Plato's conception of the soul, particularly in Plato's conception of the soul-body relationship. This makes it hard to see how the discussion of the Phaedo prepares for the discussion of the Republic and Laws (where 'plastic' often has to mean 'susceptible to education', or something similar). Confining ourselves to Brill's discussion of the Phaedo, some of the problems she discusses are obviously genuine problems, while others are much less troubling, even after she has got to work on them. For example, it is genuinely puzzling to find Socrates saying that some souls, after death, are 'intermingled with the corporeal' and 'weighed down' (81c-d), and Brill shows persuasively that the quasi-corporeal soul is an 'enigma' requiring more careful description (p. 56). On the other hand, it is difficult to feel very much troubled by Socrates encouragement to be 'eager', or to see in it, as Brill does (p. 23), an allusion to the interdependence of soul and body. Unsurprisingly, given that the project she sets herself is to find problems and tensions in Plato's conception of the soul, she argues that the myth of the Phaedo offers a critique of the arguments for immortality, even though that is not at all how the myth is presented.

The discussion of the Phaedo goes through the major parts of the dialogue in order (Socrates' self-defence, then the arguments for immortality, then the myth). Brill tries the same approach in the chapters on the Republic. This gives her far too much to talk about; often the discussion is rather descriptive, and interpretative claims are outlined only sketchily before she moves on the next part of the dialogue. Her central aims are to illustrate connections between city and soul and to show how either affects the other. She helpfully distinguishes her project from that of G. R. F. Ferrari (City and Soul in Plato's Republic, University of Chicago Press 2005): she is considering not the city-soul analogy but two kinds of causal relationship, namely how the soul is affected by its political environment, and how political institutions are affected by the souls of individual people. Unfortunately she does not get very far beyond the uncontroversial claim that city and soul 'interconnect' (p. 99). At this point I expected the discussion of 'plasticity' to focus on education and social conditioning, but Brill continues to pack more into the term -- above all when the tripartition of soul is itself treated as an aspect of the soul's plasticity (p. 107).

In the chapters on the Laws Brill sensibly abandons her previous approach. Instead of trying to touch on every part of Laws she divides the material into 'psychology for legislators', 'psychology for the legislated', and 'psychic excess'. I found the second of these most rewarding: there is some good discussion of the preludes as education. By now Brill is claiming not only that the soul is plastic but also that it is 'limitless' or 'endlessly plastic' (p. 198). As such, she says, the soul needs to have limits imposed on it by public law. It is difficult to see what in the text motivates the term 'limitless', and what the imposition of limits on the 'endlessly plastic' soul is supposed to involve. If the point is that the soul itself imposes no limits on training and education -- any soul can be made as virtuous or vicious, philosophical or non-philosophical, as the educator intends -- then laws cannot remove this capacity of the soul. What laws can do is delimit the city's educational practices so that only some of the soul's potential is realized. After reading the book it is hard work using the index to seek clarification or reminders -- for example, the index entry for 'limit' is an undivided list of 54 pages on which the term occurs, and this is not unrepresentative of the rest of the index. Those considering using the book for teaching should know that it can be heavy going: e.g., 'Contrariety thus inaugurates a dynamic of transformation that is taken to be revelatory of the immortality of the soul because it identifies a certain persistence of soul' (p.40). Transliterated Greek is used too often for those who do not know Greek, and students will find such phrases as 'psychic geography' (the title of chapter 3) off-putting -- or enticing, but for the wrong reason.

One further set of 'limits' that interests Brill are the limitations of Plato's own philosophical inquiries and models, and one of her conclusions is that all three dialogues are 'aporetic' concerning the soul (p. 207). Much of her discussion of the Republic addresses the use of medical analogies for the condition of the soul, and she argues that Plato shows the limitation of this analogy by sometimes contrasting vice and illness. (As she notes, the argument for immortality in Book 10 relies on precisely this contrast.) This side of her discussion is contextualized: she observes that Plato was not alone in using medical language of mental (or 'psychic', as Brill would say) conditions.

The book's central subject -- the plasticity of soul -- is much less contextualized. Brill urgently needs to show whether any of Plato's contemporaries or philosophical predecessors would have denied that soul is 'plastic' in the sense she intends. Not the sophists, who had their own accounts of the influence of the city on the soul and who offered to make their pupils virtuous -- or at least eloquent, in the case of Gorgias. (Protagoras claims that even courage -- the virtue most distinct from knowledge -- requires not only the right nature but 'good nurture of soul', Protagoras 351b). The question is not whether the soul can be moulded, but who should do the moulding -- the laws of Athens, as Meletus says (Apology 24d-e), or Socrates? Or (turning to the Republic) a philosopher who has actually attained the knowledge of goodness that Socrates seeks? In this context Plato may simply take for granted what Brill presents as his new contention.