Plato on the Metaphysical Foundation of Meaning and Truth

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Blake E. Hestir, Plato on the Metaphysical Foundation of Meaning and Truth, Cambridge University Press, 2016, 270 pp., ISBN 9781107132320.


Reviewed by Christine J. Thomas, Dartmouth College


Some philosophers and philosophies are defined most of all by their methods. Some are defined by their results. Plato's philosophy is remarkable for both. Blake Hestir's book admirably attends to the interaction between one of Plato's most important argumentative strategies and the substantive results of deploying that strategy. Plato relies on what Hestir calls "grounding arguments" to defend the view that the possibilities of meaning, predication and truth require entities that are stable (i.e. one and the same in at least one respect) yet also complex and combined to yield a "dynamically structured", "eternally actualizing" metaphysical foundation. According to Hestir, Plato's view that truth is a substantive (though atypical and nonrelational) property of statements finds its support in his realism about being.[1] Identifying and understanding the metaphysical foundations of truth, as Plato sees them, is the primary undertaking of Hestir's book.


As his interpretation develops, Hestir posits a revision in Plato's metaphysics from the "strong Platonism" of Phaedo, Republic and Symposium to the "restricted Platonism" of Cratylus, Theaetetus, Parmenides and Sophist. According to the ontology of strong Platonism, Forms are the fundamental beings, and Forms are: simply one (not many); always the same in the same respect; beings in every way, in no way admitting of not being; incapable of combination with other Forms (or at least with other incompatible Forms). Restricted Platonism, on the other hand, posits forms (now lower case 'f') that are: one in at least one respect, but not every respect; always the same in at least one respect, but not every respect; beings in at least one respect, but not every respect; beings which, as such, must combine with other forms. Plato is said to replace isolated, "pure" strong Platonic Forms with interactive beings that can combine with one another while remaining stable at least with respect to what they are, even if they are not stable in every respect. What motivates the shift away from strong Platonism? According to Hestir, repeated applications of grounding arguments reveal that strong Platonism can be replaced with the "more defensible ontology" of restricted Platonism (33).


Hestir locates the following paradigmatic grounding argument at Parmenides 135b-c:


GAParm1. Forms (eidê) are necessary for the possibility of meaningful discourse (dialegesthai dunamin).

GAParm2. Meaningful discourse is possible.

GAParm3. So there are forms.


Support for the premises initially comes from arguments in Cratylus and Theaetetus. In those dialogues, Socrates critically assesses a radical Heraclitean position according to which everything always moves in every way, nothing rests, and nothing is one. According to Hestir, Socrates argues that, under Heraclitean conditions, reference and predication (and being and knowledge) would be impossible. Meaningful discourse, Socrates infers, requires subjects and properties that are stable (i.e. one and the same) in at least one respect, even if not in all respects. These are heavily contested passages and Hestir skillfully navigates textual difficulties along with controversies among commentators. The discussion is thoughtful and rewarding even for those who will disagree with Hestir's reconstruction of the arguments. I would flag Chapter 4's negative assessment of the idea that Heracliteans might avail themselves of a special kind of language, Heraclitean-ese, as especially provocative and worthy of attention.


Like Hestir, I read Plato as self-consciously relying on grounding arguments (though I characterize them somewhat differently) in order to defend basic tenets of his metaphysics and semantics. I also agree with Hestir that some of the most important grounding arguments fall short of defending strong Platonism. Even so, I am less confident that the arguments Hestir considers from the Cratylus and Theaetetus are intended to support restricted Platonism directly, or are successful in defending any kind of Platonism at all. The sort of stability required for referential and predicative success might very well be met by, for example, Aristotelian particulars and universals. I am not sure that Hestir would disagree with this last point. At times, he remarks that Plato claims more for his grounding arguments than they actually establish (e.g. see page 10, including note 40). But at other points in the book he is surprisingly sanguine about attributing to Plato the view that it is built into the stability required for merely meaningful discourse that the requisite beings are Platonic objects of definition and knowledge. He says:


For Plato, the condition of being the same in at least one respect is being always the same f, being that f that explains what it is to be f. And as far as Plato is concerned, none of the many f-things can explain what it is to be f even if there only one f-thing and it is f for a very long time (54).


If Hestir is right, then the first premise of the Parmenides' grounding argument is far more controversial than it might appear at first glance. Hestir recognizes that it is a "significant argumentative leap" to require the eternal stability of Platonic forms for referential and predicative success. Yet this leap is called upon to support Hestir's fairly deflationary reading of dialegesthai dunamin as the capacity for "meaningful discourse." If Plato instead wished to ground the possibility of full-blown dialectic in the Parmenides, requiring the "definitional stability" Platonic explanatory entities could provide would make (at least a little bit) more sense. Hestir might very well be right about the various attributions to Plato and their implications for Plato's semantics, but I'm not sure that he is, and I expect that readers of Part I would benefit from a more expanded discussion of why Plato is tempted by the argumentative leap and how he might defend the leap, if, indeed, he makes it.


While a good portion of the book considers the conditions on the possibility of meaningful discourse, the bulk of it -- and its heart, it seems to me -- is occupied with articulating what it is for a form (or any being) to have being, either in virtue of itself or with respect to something else. Since truth depends on being, the book strives to characterize Plato's commitments in the Sophist to being as a "greatest kind" and to the various roles that being plays in structuring reality. I cannot do justice here to the insightful and detailed arguments in these chapters of the book. I will mention only a few of their many enticing findings.


Hestir argues that being is a fundamental, atypical kind; it just is the kind that functions to make capacities and their realization in combination actual. Beings, as such, have or are capacities to affect and to be affected. According to Hestir, "the kind being just is capacity and the realization of that capacity in combinations" (145). Moreover, being runs through all beings (153). A form's internal combination with the kind being is a precondition of its further capacity to combine with any other being (156). Hestir claims that "what needs to be internally 'held together' is a form's sameness, difference, and essential content" (155). Unified, well-individuated beings are then eligible to enter into relations and combinations with other individuated beings. The kind being, as capacity and combination, grounds all ontological unity, stability and combination. Understanding being in this way helps to explain, in part, Plato's claim that "it is the nature of the kinds to commune with each other" (Soph. 257a9).


With a conception of the metaphysical structure of forms in place, we are well-situated to appreciate the first premise of a second important grounding argument from Sophist 259d-e:


GASoph1. The combination of forms is necessary for the possibility of statement.

GASoph2. Statement is possible.

GASoph3. So the forms combine.


Hestir proposes that the investigation of the kinds being, difference and same in the Sophist reveals, first, that forms must combine with other forms if they are to exist at all, and, second, that forms must combine with other beings in ontic predications to ground true statements.


An efficient formulation, and one which displays the various connections of interest to Hestir, can be found in the following account of truth for a statement:


STATE: The statement 's is f' is true ↔ the form signified by 'f' has being in the case of the subject named by 's' (218).


Truth (or falsity) requires, first of all, a statement, something truth-evaluable. A simple list of words is not a candidate for being true (or false). The Sophist proposes that some types of terms, names (onomata), must be capable of fitting together with other types of terms, verbs or predicates (rhêmata), to produce statements (logoi). Statements "accomplish something" by asserting or denying. Both 'Theaetetus is sitting' and 'Theatetus is flying' are statements. Both are realizations of the capacities of certain words to combine. But one is true and the other false. The first has the property of being true, since in its case the entities designated by the words in the statement are in fact combined as the statement asserts. The second is false since, although it successfully asserts something, the metaphysical conditions on truth are not satisfied.


'Theaetetus is sitting' is true if and only if the form sitting has being in the case of Theaetetus. Hestir explains:


that sitting is available as a form means that it must be combined with at least being, same, and different prior to entering into a relation with Theaetetus. Such combination is necessary for sitting being a being, being self-identical and being different from other things. That sitting holds of Theatetus requires these combinations in addition to the straightforward participation of Theaetetus in sitting (146).


In the example, truth depends on 'sitting' signifying the form sitting, 'Theaetetus' naming Theatetus and on the form sitting having being relative to the perceptible Theaetetus. The account of truth which Hestir reconstructs accords priority to properties of subjects, to the forms predicated of a subject. Since the form f makes something else to be f (and not vice versa), the f's having being relative to s is the truthmaking condition for 's is f.'


For Plato, truth depends on being. Statements are true in virtue of the world being a certain way, in virtue of highly complex metaphysical structures and relations. The kind being (along with other kinds) ensures that forms exist and makes possible the combination of forms with other beings in ontic predications. But, according to Hestir, the Sophist's substantive realist conditions on truth do not require additional, "seriously dyadic" relations of correspondence or congruence between statements and facts. Truth requires structured being. But, Hestir suggests, truth is not defined in terms of any isomorphism or mirroring relation between statements and reality.


Blake Hestir's scholarship has consistently encouraged readers of Plato and Aristotle to pay closer attention to the rich, sometimes unexpected details of their conceptions of truth and falsity. This book is an accomplished, welcome extension of Hestir's efforts to date. I especially appreciated the impressive engagement with the Sophist's metaphysics and the patient accounting of Plato's conception of truth. For students of Plato's semantics and metaphysics more generally, Hestir's book offers lots of food for thought. I highly recommend it.

[1]While focusing primarily on Plato’s willingness to predicate truth of correct statements, Hestir acknowledges that Plato also seems to think that truth simply is being (5, 235ff.).