Plato on the Value of Philosophy: the Art of Argument in the Gorgias and Phaedrus

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Tushar Irani, Plato on the Value of Philosophy: the Art of Argument in the Gorgias and Phaedrus, Cambridge University Press, 2017, 201 pp., $99.99, ISBN 9781107181984.

Reviewed by Frisbee C. C. Sheffield, University of Cambridge


The central contention of this book is that the way in which we approach argument, for Plato, reveals something about our desires and motivations, particularly with respect to others (p. 3), and so the key to engaging in argument correctly is found in an understanding of the human soul (p. 4). "This book is the first to argue that what the traditional pursuit of rhetoric lacks for Plato is a comprehensive understanding of the human soul and its characteristic good" (p. 4). The Phaedrus makes it explicit that rhetoric needs an understanding of the soul (270c), but the real contribution of this enjoyable and readable book lies in the detailed arguments for this view, and the way in which it reads the Gorgias and the Phaedrus so closely together. Though many scholars have noted the relationship between the Gorgias and the Phaedrus, arguing that the latter provides the account of rhetoric suggested, though not explored in the Gorgias (Bernadette (1991); McCoy (2008); Yunis (2011); Moss (2012)),[1] the contribution of this book lies in its sustained development of this thesis, which aims to show that the Phaedrus is essential to "completing the story begun in the Gorgias" (p. 4, 19, 62-3). Both dialogues compare the rhetorical art with the medical art, in a way that focuses on the kind of care required in both domains (p. 164, 170). Just as we must determine the nature of the body in medicine, so too, in order to provide this care, must we determine the nature of the soul in rhetoric (Phdr. 270b5-6). There are further strands to this thesis, which touches on politics, interpersonal relations and moral psychology, all of which are shown to be inextricably related to rhetoric in these dialogues. Once armed with the Phaedrus's account of soul and the human good (flagged as important, though under-developed in the Gorgias) we can appreciate the distinctive way in which philosophical argument benefits and read the Phaedrus "as justifying Socrates' use of argument as a therapeutic practice" (p. 181).

Irani's main argument falls into two strands. Plato accepted with his contemporaries that the practice of politics and the practice of argument are connected, but their conceptions of politics differ: for Socrates, it is the art of care (Grg. 464a), understood as benefitting others (p. 18), not (with Callicles) dominating others. These different political aims influence their respective approaches to argument and how they engage with other persons. These two points are related: for Callicles, the purpose of argument is to overpower, and this is because, from the perspective of his self-interest, he regards others only instrumentally, as competitors to be manipulated or outdone. This is the "politics strand" of the argument (p. 19). Socrates, by contrast, claims to benefit others, on the basis of views about the human soul and its good. This is the "moral psychology strand" of the argument (p. 19).

The opening chapters develop the "politics strand" and show that the motivational attitudes of the rhetorician and the philosopher in the Gorgias are crucial to informing their practices (p. 45), thus showing how the "moral psychology and politics strands of [the] argument become intertwined" (p. 21). Though Socrates seeks to benefit, not dominate, in argument, this raises challenges, explored in Chapter 2, such as why his interlocutors fail to understand that motive and whether he can justify his use of argument as a therapeutic practice. To appreciate why Polus is mistaken to think that the compulsion he feels in philosophical argument is forced on him from the outside, we need a better sense of the "self", which is the subject over which Socrates exerts his argumentative power (p. 65).

The idea that a key difference between the rhetorical and the philosophical ethos lies in the desires that motivate their practitioners (p. 65-6) is further explored in Chapter 3, by drawing attention to the passage in which the "two loves" of Socrates and Callicles are discussed (Grg. 481c-d): "By calling attention to their different interpersonal attitudes, Socrates opens his exchange with Callicles by signalling how these different expressions of eros inform their respective ways of life and their respective approaches to politics" (p. 69). "Whereas for Callicles the ultimate aim of argument is to use others for the promotion of one's personal interests; for Socrates, the aim is to promote the common interest, which entails the promotion of the good of others" (p. 86); indeed, "for Socrates, his love of Alcibiades follows naturally from his love of philosophy" (p. 69). This supports a larger thesis in the book, which is that a commitment to the pursuit of wisdom entails a commitment to the good of others (p. 7, 146-163, 183-192). The opening chapters do much to show that there is a "social dimension" to argument, underpinned by motivational commitments, though the nature of Socrates' attachment to Alcibiades remained puzzling. Irani is able to show that Socrates' commitment to Alcibiades is consistent with his commitment to philosophy (p. 88), but not (yet) that it is entailed by it. Why should an eros for an individual (rather than the philia relation more prominent in this work: Irani, p. 82-7; Woolf (2000); Kamtekar (2005)[2]), follow from a love of wisdom, let alone a love "for his own sake", an issue on which Irani agrees the Gorgias "remains silent" (p. 85)?

Having argued that one's attitude towards argument is of crucial importance to informing its practice, in Chapter 4 Irani explores Callicles' hedonism and Socrates' attempt to vindicate the philosophical life (p. 96-9). Callicles remains unconvinced by Socrates because his "love of the people and the value system it implies -- a life devoted to using others for the promotion of one's personal interests -- prevents him from accepting Socrates' conception of the good life and his alternative approach to human relations" (p. 105). This raises what has been termed "the difficulty" for the Gorgias, namely: if eros determines one's attitude to argument, how can an eros enraptured by other values be affected by the kinds of arguments Socrates provides (Woolf (2000); Doyle (2010))?[3] Irani argues that "even if Socrates does hope to persuade his interlocutors to accept his views, the means by which he tries to do so is by redirecting their desires" (p. 105). Though not shown successfully in the Gorgias, this task is undertaken in the Phaedrus. The ground is prepared well for the Phaedrus.

In Part II, Irani explores the account of motivation and the soul in the Phaedrus and shows how it informs the account of an art of argument (p. 64). Chapter 5 clarifies two kinds of eros operative in Socrates and Lysias' accounts of love, in order to identify what motivates the philosopher versus the rhetorician. Irani argues that the distinction between two kinds of love tracks the meta-ethical theory of the Gorgias that distinguishes between the pleasant and the good (p. 113, n. 3). Chapter 7 explores how loving wisdom accounts for the difference between a rhetorical and a philosophical engagement in argument: a love of wisdom grounds an interest in the soul and its characteristic good, which is why philosophical eros can benefit another. Irani attends to the language in which philosophical eros is described: madness, compulsion and necessity (p. 134-145). There is much interesting material in this discussion, though there are also some puzzling sections. For example, Irani argues against "the standard reading", that "all love" (e.g. in the Symposium) "is instrumental in nature and seeks possession of its object" (p. 145), a view apparently corrected by the "less self-serving" model of the Phaedrus (p. 144). But the Symposium makes it explicit that though eros is self-interested, it is not a possessive desire, but a creative one, with the beautiful object inspiring transformative work on the part of the lover (206d). In this, as in much else, the Symposium and the Phaedrus seem to be in agreement. The kind of love that takes the nature of the other as central (Phdr. 252e3, p. 144) is grounds for a developing relationship of philia, so need not be posed as a solution to a problem about eros; rather, the Phaedrus (in line with Irani's general view of that work) resolves issues left under-explored there.

Though it is not controversial to claim that psychology is central to the Phaedrus' account of rhetoric (271d), there is substantial disagreement over what features of the palinode's psychology are relevant, how exactly they contribute, and how if at all, they inform Socrates' own practice in the dialogue. In Chapter 8, Irani shifts the focus from the chariot allegory to the account of soul as a "self-mover" which precedes it, and argues that this is identified, not with the soul as a whole (the charioteer and two horses), but with the rational part alone (p. 175). Through comparisons with Alcidamas, it is argued that the "ensouled speech" of the true rhetorician is "a mode of discourse whose power is derived from a person's own intellectual resources, rather than the authority of someone else" (p. 177); it is "the practice of reasoned inquiry and argument" (p. 177). Since it is through this activity that we express our nature as self- movers and perfect the kind of creatures we are (p. 177), it is to this part of the soul that the rhetorician must appeal in his practice if he is to provide benefits to another (p. 166). Further, this is possible only for the philosophical lover, who attends to the nature of the other as a reason seeker. This love of wisdom informs Socrates' love for Phaedrus (p. 147) and his speech-making in the palinode itself (p. 151-160), which is aimed primarily (though not exclusively, p. 162) at the reason-seeking part of Phaedrus' soul (p. 156) and reflects the motivation of the philosophical lover in the palinode (p. 160). Once this is appreciated we can see that this account of philosophical discourse is the same care of the soul that Socrates identifies in the Gorgias as the political art (p. 164). "Socrates' regard for the rational nature of his interlocutors absolves him of the charge of trying to dominate others" (p. 165). We have, then, an answer to why the attitude towards argument exhibited in the Gorgias cannot benefit: if you seek only to dominate, you cannot attend to the nature of the other as an independent reason seeker, which is our highest good (p. 180):

Thus the Phaedrus may be read as justifying Socrates' use of argument as a therapeutic practice. For if it is essential to human happiness that we bring our desires in line with our values, and if it is in virtue of our status as reasoners that we can understand those values, then the role of the rational part of the soul in achieving the human good is assured (p. 181).

Irani is right that reading the two dialogues closely together has numerous benefits. Though other studies have pointed to comparisons between the two works, none has explored them so richly. There are times when the drive for continuity eclipses differences, not just between those two works, but also between the second and first parts of the Phaedrus. Rhetoric in the second half of the Phaedrus is practised by someone with knowledge, for the purposes of teaching (some form of didactic, or demonstrative, dialectic, which differs from at least Socrates' own practice in the Gorgias, and, arguably, from the philosophy described in the Phaedrus' palinode). This makes it tricky to identify philosophy (in all its forms, at least) with the requirements for rhetoric suggested in the Gorgias and developed in the second part of the Phaedrus (both of which are concerned with teaching, Grg. 457c7; Phdr. 265d5, 278a2). It is not just knowledge of the human soul required here (as Irani suggests, p. 171-2); the claim is that whoever can compose speeches, knowing the truth, and defend them, we call a philosopher (Phdr. 287b7). It is worth noting how far this is from Socrates' repeated insistence in the dialogues that he is not a teacher, and shares in no art of speaking (e.g. Apology 17b). This is the sort of difficulty which has led Charles H. Kahn (1986: 373) and Alexander Nehamas (1999: 352) to argue that the Phaedrus marks a transitional moment in Plato's conception of philosophy, with the first and second parts of the work operating with different views.[4] If there are differences between (and within) these practices of argument, does that fact affect some of the interpersonal requirements?

For Irani, "the friendship expressed by the lover for his beloved in the palinode is an attitude Plato thinks characterizes Socrates' relationship to others" (though the lovers in the palinode are at an immature stage of development so not all discursive exchange will be structured by the asymmetry there, p. 161-2). And yet, we see productive dialectical exchanges between those in a dialogue like the Sophist, for example, with little sense of any intimate interpersonal relationship between the participants of the sort detailed in the Phaedrus. So, what is it about the practice(s) described in the second half of the Phaedrus that motivates such requirements, and how robust are these interpersonal commitments (which Irani says apply in "general terms", p. 162)? Though it is no doubt true that "the philosopher, a genuine lover of wisdom who responds appropriately to the experience of beauty in others, should cultivate that nature when engaging others in argument" (p. 184), more is required for the subsequent claim: "if this is right, a criterion for determining whether we value wisdom as an intrinsic good for Plato -- and thus whether we engage in argument correctly -- is whether we value others as self-movers: whether we value others for their own sake". From this thesis, Irani hopes to bolster a claim running throughout the book that the pursuit of wisdom entails a commitment to the good of others and to contribute to debates about ethical eudaimonism (p. 185-8).

But is the love of wisdom reducible to the love of argument thus conceived? Though any interpersonal relationship (such as that involved in politics, or the rhetoric discussed in the second half of the Phaedrus concerned with teaching and learning, 278a2) may need to be informed by a love of wisdom, this is not sufficient for the stronger claim that a criterion for determining whether we value wisdom as an intrinsic good as such requires, or entails, such an interpersonal relationship. I suspect Irani's view is that however argument, or speech-making, is employed and whether it is employed personally or politically, for any of the above discursive practices, when it is considered as an art, which aims to benefit, then its logoi in all their forms will be subject to the account described in the book. The art of argument requires "a kind of soul-leading whose concern is for the nature of one's interlocutor as a self-mover" (p. 180). If so, then the upshot of Irani's view is that when the Phaedrus "completes" the art of rhetoric from the Gorgias it does so in a way that leaves that practice barely recognizable and possibly unattainable (Werner: 2010).[5]

Though many of the issues explored here will no doubt be much debated, it is a thought-provoking study, which is well-argued, informed by detailed discussion of texts, and which sustains the parallels between the two dialogues throughout. It contributes to discussions of the Gorgias, the Phaedrus, rhetoric, moral psychology and Platonic love, and I would recommend it to anyone with interests in these areas.

[1] Bernadette, S. The Rhetoric of Morality and Philosophy: Plato's Gorgias and Phaedrus (Chicago: 1991); McCoy, M. Plato on the Rhetoric of Philosophers and Sophists (Cambridge: 2008); Yunis, H. Plato: Phaedrus (Cambridge: 2011); Moss, J. "Soul-Leading: The Unity of Plato's Phaedrus, Again", Oxford Studies in Ancient Philosophy (2012).

[2] R. Kamtekar, "The Profession of Friendship: Callicles, democratic politics and rhetorical education in Plato's Gorgias", Ancient Philosophy 25 (2005) 319-339.

[3] Woolf, R., "Callicles and Psychic (dis)Harmony in the Gorgias", Oxford Studies in Ancient Philosophy 18 (2000) 1-40; Doyle, J., "Socrates and Gorgias", Phronesis 55 (2010) 1-25.

[4] Kahn, C., Plato and the Socratic Dialogue: The Philosophical Use of a Literary Form (Cambridge: 1986); Nehamas, A., Virtues of Authenticity: Essays on Plato and Socrates (Princeton: 1999).

[5] Werner, D., "Rhetoric and Philosophy in Plato's Phaedrus", Greece and Rome 57 (2010), 21-46.