Plato: Political Philosophy

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Malcolm Schofield, Plato: Political Philosophy, Oxford University Press, 2006, 400pp., $35.00 (pbk), ISBN 0199249466.

Reviewed by Richard Kraut, Northwestern University


Malcolm Schofield has written an outstanding overview and critical assessment of Plato's political philosophy.  As befits a volume meant to be accessible to non-specialists, he ranges widely over many topics and emphasizes the ways in which Plato is still able to engage a contemporary reader committed to open-minded reflection on the norms that should govern the modern nation-state.  At the same time, Schofield brings to this work a deep understanding of Plato's embeddedness in the culture of fifth and fourth century Athens.  Accordingly, Plato: Political Philosophy is filled both with references to contemporary political thought (R. Dworkin, J. Habermas, J. Rawls, M. Walzer, and B. Williams), and to Aristophanes, Isocrates, Thucydides, and Xenophon. Schofield is also thoroughly immersed in the enormous literature that has gathered around Plato's political writings, and he is unfailingly fair-minded in his treatment (often, but not always, confined to endnotes) of other authors.  There is no better way to enter this aspect of Plato's thought than to read this fine contribution to the series, Founders of Modern Political and Social Thought, edited by Mark Philp.

On most readings of Plato, he is far removed from many of the assumptions that are central to the liberal and democratic traditions that now dominate political philosophy.  One would have to strain to find in him anything hospitable to such notions as human equality, freedom of conscience, rights to political participation, limited government, constitutional rule, and so on.  Although Schofield is by no means a proponent of Plato's leading ideas -- rule by philosophers, abolition of the family and property, noble lies -- he argues that many of Plato's concerns are not distant from our own.  He emphasizes the value of Plato's reflections on the kind of unity a political community should try to achieve, and on the need to bring reasoned thought and knowledge to bear on public deliberations.  He holds that Plato

has a field day with his devastating and still damaging critique of the shortcomings of democracy, and particularly the difficulty it has in acknowledging the authority of knowledge… .  His analysis of human acquisitiveness … as pathological … puts another disturbing question which retains its relevance… .  Plato's conviction of the need even in utopia for the cohesive power of an ideology grounded in religion demands to be taken a lot more seriously in the early twenty-first century than it was in the relative calm of the secular post-war decades (pp. 332-333).

This is a book that places the Republic at the center of Plato's political philosophy.  The Statesman is certainly not ignored, nor is the Laws. Schofield is also attentive to the political significance of many of Plato's other writings -- particularly the Apology, Charmides, Crito, Euthydemus, Gorgias, Protagoras, and Menexenus.  But no one can quarrel with Schofield's idea that it is the Republic that in some sense lies at the center of Plato's project. That is because his other political writings can best be understood by tracing their relationship to that pivotal text.  Schofield is of course aware that some outstanding scholars -- Chris Bobonich foremost among them -- argue that Plato's political thinking changes in far-reaching ways, and that in the Laws he becomes more hospitable to democracy, because he has by then adopted a metaphysics of value that acknowledges the epistemological resources of non-philosophers.  But although Schofield does not dogmatically insist that Plato's works form a seamless unity, he finds no radical break between the Republic, Statesman, and Laws. These dialogues, he thinks, are preoccupied with different problems, and approach politics from different angles; perhaps they cannot be entirely brought into line with each other.  (For example, he notes that the noble lies in the Republic have disappeared from the Laws, having been replaced by rational theology.)  Nonetheless, he adopts the traditional view that takes the Republic and the Laws to be largely consonant with each other, the former work acknowledging that its utopia may never be achieved, the latter providing a blueprint for an approximation to that ideal that is not beyond the grasp of ordinary people who want to play a role in political life, own land, and live in conventional households.

Because Schofield thinks that an account of Plato's political thought need not be told as a narrative, there being no sharp turns in its development, he organizes his discussion around some of the leading themes that run through many of the dialogues.  The first two chapters seek to justify the emphasis the volume places on the Republic, and orient the reader to the themes of that dialogue.  Schofield expresses skepticism about the authenticity of Plato's Seventh Letter, which purports to situate Plato's political philosophy in the context of his visits to the Syracusan court of Dionysius I and his son.  Schofield's distrust of this document is based on his astute observation that Plato is "the most reticent of philosophical writers" (p. 17).  Having suppressed his own voice through the construction of dialogues in which he never speaks directly to the reader, why would he reveal himself so openly through the publication of a letter available to all?  That would be an "abrupt lurch out of his own carefully constructed literary persona" (p. 17).  So Schofield counsels us not to read Plato as some of those who accept the authenticity of the Seventh Letter would have us read him: as someone who arrived at his views for purely personal reasons, that is, because of his disillusionment with Athens after the death of Socrates.

Schofield's second chapter ("Athens, Freedom, and Democracy") also works out the framework he will use for fitting together Plato's major political writings into a whole that is only roughly unified. He seeks a position between that of Julia Annas, who finds in the Statesman a "newly sensible evaluation of democracy" (p. 60) and Christopher Rowe, who finds in all of Plato's works a "single preferred model for constitutional features" (p. 61). What these authors miss, Schofield claims, is that Plato "shows comparatively little interest in constitutional theory or practice at any stage in his life" and was no less a political theorist because of that, just as Toqueville's Democracy in America can be appreciated for "the penetration of his account of American society and the American way of life" (p. 61).  Using Michael Walzer's categories of "immanent" versus "rejectionist" social critiques -- criticism that works either from within or against a social system -- he portrays the Republic as rejectionist and the Laws as immanent (pp. 54, 81). They are, in other words, devoted to different (but not incompatible) projects.  "Ultimately the point is one about … rhetorical register.  In the Laws, Plato has elected to talk to his readers in language that (unlike the Republic) offers no challenge to the conceptual framework with which they are antecedently familiar" (p. 81).

In his third chapter ("Problematizing Democracy"), Schofield turns to Plato's critique of democratic equality and freedom in Republic Book VIII, and to the criticism of democracy embedded in Book VI's analogy between statesmanship and nautical expertise (a theme elaborated by the investigation of political expertise in the Statesman).  Plato's strategy, as he sees it, is to show the weakness of a democratic ideal by pushing it to its extreme form.  Democratic freedom, so treated, promotes a permissive ethos that is at bottom anarchic.  Schofield credits Plato with an insight into the logic of democracy: it inherently leads to a corrosive plurality of ways of life.  Against Julia Annas, who takes Plato's caricature to be utterly false to the facts of Athenian life, Schofield insists that there was a widespread problem of law enforcement in Plato's Athens, as we can see, for example, from the ease with which Socrates could have been sprung from jail (p. 118).  Schofield also defends the Republic against a complaint made by Bernard Williams, who thought that Plato was committed to the silly idea that the diversity of values in a democratic city can be explained only if it is assumed that every democratic citizen is devoted to that plurality.

Chapter Four ("The Rule of Knowledge") begins with a fascinating contrast between the lessons that two eminent Victorians -- John Stuart Mill and Benjamin Jowett -- took from their reading of Plato.  What Mill admired in Plato was not only his opposition to the conventional and commonplace but also the ideal of scientific governance, embodied in a professionalized core of liberally educated citizens  (p. 139).  Jowett, by contrast, took the expertise Plato required of a ruling elite to be otherworldly metaphysics. Plato's insight, as Jowett saw it, was his recognition that the best rulers are those for whom political life goes against the grain of their true interests and personality.  Schofield suggests that both versions of Plato are present in his works: the "scientific governor" inhabits the Statesman, with its emphasis on the architectonic structure of political expertise, whereas Jowett's otherworldly ruler lingers outside the cave of the Republic, and is loath to return to it.  If I understand Schofield correctly, he takes there to be an unresolved tension in Plato's thinking between the attractions of philosophy and the demands of justice.

Schofield's fifth chapter ("Utopia") astutely defends utopianism, as Plato conceived it, as a desirable and even inescapable element of systematic political reflection.  He defines utopian thinking as "the imagining of a blueprint for a desired world which is nevertheless located in present-day concerns, with questions about practicability and legitimacy not necessarily excluded, but regarded as secondary" (p. 199).  A large portion of this chapter is devoted to a discussion of the Republic's ideal of social harmony, which Schofield rightly views as one of the principal organizing ideas of Plato's political thought.  Against Aristotle's objection that Plato's goal of having all citizens feel each other's pains and pleasures is unworkable, Schofield notes that Plato "would not have been surprised by the phenomenon of millions throughout the world mourning … the death of the first pope of the globalized era" (p. 227).

Chapter Six ("Money and the Soul") begins with a passage from John Maynard Keynes's Essays in Persuasion: "When the accumulation of wealth is no longer of high social importance … . [t]he love of money as a possession … . will be recognized [as] one of those …  semi-pathological propensities which one hands over with a shudder to the specialists in mental disease" (p. 250).  The condemnation of greed was of course not original to Plato; as Schofield notes, it was a commonplace of Greek drama and historical writing.  Plato's original contribution was to integrate the love of money into a general picture of human appetitiveness. That leads Schofield to discuss this lowest part of the human soul and Plato's depiction of it in Books VIII and IX of the Republic. He concludes with the observation that "the problem of how to restrain the appetites of the economic class remains with us" (p. 275).

The seventh and last chapter ("Ideology") is principally devoted to the theme of political deception in the Republic, and the replacement of such lies by the rational religion of the Laws.  Schofield is hard on Hannah Arendt, who wrote in "Truth and Politics" in support of Cornford's translation of pseudos as "bold flight of invention" and insisted that Plato's myth of the metals can "under no circumstances … be understood as a recommendation of lying as we understand it" (p. 302).  He reminds us that Plato's eugenic program depends on what can only be called lies, and argues that although Plato's contemporaries were by no means absolutists, allowing deception in various circumstances, Plato was nonetheless challenging the norms of truth-telling of his society.  Schofield argues, furthermore, that the noble lie embedded in the myth of the metals is the "principal device" used to secure the philosophers' allegiance to kallipolis (p. 303).  What makes them go back to the cave is a patriotism anchored in an emotionally satisfying myth whose psychological force overpowers their recognition of the superiority of the case for living an apolitical and purely philosophical life (p. 308).  If I understand this correctly, the philosophers of the ideal city are not, after all, completely ruled by reason.

This summary of a small sample of the themes and conclusions of Plato: Political Philosophy should convey how rich and wide-ranging a work it is.  It will endure as an indispensable guide not only to its principal subject -- the Republic -- but to all of Plato's political writings, and to their enduring interest today.