Plato's Cosmology and its Ethical Dimensions

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Gabriela Roxana Carone, Plato's Cosmology and its Ethical Dimensions, Cambridge University Press, 2005, 332pp., $70.00 (hbk), 0521845602.

Reviewed by William Prior, Santa Clara University


The main theme of this book is that the cosmology of Plato's later works is connected to his ethics. The author offers a fairly extensive treatment of the intersection between these two areas of Plato's thought in four late dialogues: the Timaeus, Philebus, Statesman and Laws. An introductory chapter offers a preliminary discussion of the topic and introduces three secondary theses: 1) that the Demiurge of the Timaeus is a symbol of cosmic reason rather than an actual causal agent, 2) that Plato's philosophy of mind is closer to Aristotelian hylomorphism than to Cartesian dualism, and 3) that the late Platonic cosmology offers possibilities for widespread happiness lacking in the portrait of the philosopher-king in the Republic, who derives happiness from the contemplation of the Forms. The introduction also makes the case for taking Plato's myths seriously and discusses the difficult issue of consistency among Plato's works.

Carone first considers the cosmology of the Timaeus. In her second chapter she argues that, though on a literal reading of the dialogue Plato appears to be committed to creation in time and the existence of a creator deity (the Demiurge or Craftsman), it is possible, and in fact preferable, to read the Demiurge and creation as mythical expressions of the rational activity of cosmic reason in the form of the World-Soul. In her third chapter she develops the idea that, as the World-Soul is the bearer of cosmic reason, it provides a model for rational activity for the individual human soul. In particular, she argues that, as the motion of the heavenly bodies is the result of the activity of the World-Soul, contemplation of the heavens can provide a teleological model for humans seeking to develop their own rationality and to obtain happiness thereby (Plato never doubted that reason was the key to human happiness). Very few people, she urges, can attain happiness in the manner of the philosopher-king of the Republic, through contemplation of the Forms. The possibility of gaining happiness by contemplation of the heavens, which she equates with astronomy, makes happiness available to "the masses."

If the Timaeus is a cosmological work with ethical aspects, the Philebus is primarily a work on ethics with, arguably, cosmological implications. This dialogue divides reality into four classes: the unlimited, limit, the combination of the two, and the cause of combination, which is said to be mind. In the fourth chapter Carone discusses the question of the consistency between this ontology and the ontology of separate Forms (and the related doctrine of Being and Becoming) that is found in the middle dialogues and the Timaeus. She argues for consistency between the Philebus and these other works. In the fifth chapter she applies the account of four classes first to the analysis of pleasure and then to the good life. Plato thought many, though not all, pleasures, belonged to the mixed class. He thought that unrestrained pleasure was bad, but that pleasure limited by reason was a component in the best human life. Drawing on a contrast of Gregory Vlastos between the elitism of the middle dialogues and the populism of the Socrates of the early dialogues, she argues that the Philebus combines these two views: arguing for a conception of happiness that is available to all, while not abandoning the claim that the philosophical life is best.

Chapters six and seven are devoted to the cosmological myth of the Statesman. In this myth Plato claims that the cosmos goes through two recurrent phases: in the first, God is in control of the motions of the heavens, whereas in the second He allows the cosmos to move in accordance with its own internal principles. According to the traditional interpretation, we live in the age that is not under God's control. Carone argues that the sequence of phases is progressive rather than simply recurrent, and that our phase (the age of Zeus, in contrast to the age of Cronos) is still under divine guidance. This guidance, however, is not the direct rule of God that characterizes theocracy (the age of Cronos), but a relation that gives to humans considerable autonomy and permits the existence of political relations among humans. She also argues that the myth's alternating cycles cannot be interpreted literally, but that the opposing movements represent constant opposing tensions in the cosmos.

Finally, in chapter eight, she deals with the cosmology of Laws X. This chapter contains Plato's most famous theodicy. He argues that the gods exist, that they care about us, and that they cannot be swayed by non-rational means, such as prayers and sacrifices. What primarily interests Carone in this book is its account of evil: Plato, she holds, regards humans as the source of evil, and she thinks that we need to be enlisted in the cosmic fight against it. (This sounds to me like an Augustinian diagnosis, but Augustine was of course a great Platonist. It is not an Augustinian solution to the problem of evil.)

This is a scholarly work, though not, I think, a particularly philosophical one. The references to the literature are thorough. The argument is thoughtful. It contains numerous insights into Plato's late philosophy. I agree with many of her claims. The disagreements I express below with some of Carone's theses should not be seen as detracting from those facts. Disagreement is the order of the day in classical philosophy, as readers of this review will know. If Carone writes as a scholar, she sometimes at least writes as a Platonist, as one who is engaged in internal discussion with the Platonic tradition. She seems to be trying to make Plato compatible with dominant modern philosophical doctrines, such as psychological materialism. I suspect that she concedes more to modernity than Plato would find acceptable.

Carone's general thesis is, or ought to be, uncontroversial. It is amply exemplified in Plato's later dialogues. Had Carone extended her discussion to other Platonic dialogues such as the Republic, she would have found the thesis exemplified there as well. Plato's general view is not new, but is descended from the Presocratic idea that human reason is the same in kind as cosmic reason, part of the view that the individual human being is related to the cosmos as microcosm to macrocosm (a doctrine with which she is familiar, but of which I think she does not make enough). This idea is also found in the Stoics, and it has a close relative in the Judaeo-Christian idea that man is made in the image of God. This idea may lack currency today, but it was commonplace in the ancient world; this fact alone can explain why Plato's cosmology was seen as central to his thought in ancient times, but is now peripheral. (There is of course one respect in which Plato's cosmology remains of central importance. The principles of cosmic order were for Plato mathematical. The world was rational precisely because it was mathematically ordered. This great Pythagorean idea, one of the most significant products of ancient philosophy of science, influenced not only such modern scientists as Kepler and Galileo, but investigators of nature today. The idea that mathematics is the language of nature is a Platonic idea.)

I do not think that Carone's three secondary theses are anything like as obviously true as her primary thesis. Consider first her claim that the Demiurge, Plato's creator God in the Timaeus, is a symbol and not a real causal agent. Now Plato's scheme, involving both a creator god and a cosmic World-Soul, appears to contain some redundancy. Why are both a transcendent rational principle and an immanent principle needed for the ordering of the cosmos? If Plato held that the world was created in time, it is easy to distinguish between the transcendent causal principle that exists before creation and the immanent causal principle of the World-Soul. Even if he did not believe in a literal creation, however (and many of his ancient followers thought he did not), the distinction between the transcendent, eternal cause, in touch with the Forms, and the immanent cause rotating cosmic circles like a gyroscope, seems thoroughly Platonic. I can't think that Carone's relegation of the Demiurge to the status of a symbol is correct. (In the end, though, I can't see that this matters for her thesis. Rationality is where you find it in the universe, and the Demiurge and World-Soul are equally appropriate models for human rationality.)

Nor can I accept her view that the late cosmology offers the hope of more widespread happiness than middle Platonism with its philosopher-king and Forms. (The contrast drawn by Vlastos between the "populist" Socrates of the early dialogues and the "elitist" Socrates of the Republic seems to me to be clearly false.) In the first place, it is not clear to me that Plato denies happiness to any of the citizens of his Republic. What he denies is that the citizens who are not philosophers can become happy by the operation of their own autonomous reason. These members of the warrior and economic classes would fail to be happy in other regimes because internal psychic conflict would make them miserable. They need the philosopher to provide rational guidance. From the Protagoras to the Philebus Plato thought that reason was the key to happiness, and that pleasure, uncontrolled by reason, was its great enemy.

Secondly, though astronomy may make some happy (Ptolemy said it lifted him up among the gods), it is just as intellectual an activity as philosophy. It is a purely rational activity, according to Rep. VII. Members of the economic class, and most warriors, are as unlikely to engage in it as to philosophize. Plato was not a democrat. He was an aristocrat, though he cared for the happiness of all. The idea that "the many" (Plato would not say "the masses") could attain happiness by their own means is not one that would have recommended itself to him. To think otherwise is to try to make Plato into something he wasn't, and something that he would not have found attractive.

Her third secondary thesis, that Plato's psychology is not dualistic but hylomorphic, is suggestive, but it is not developed enough to provide a persuasive alternative to traditional dualism. I think Plato needs a dualist psychology to make sense of his theory of reincarnation, to make it possible for the soul to attain its vision of the gods and the Forms, as described in the Symposium, Republic and Phaedrus, all dialogues of significance for Plato's cosmology. Psychological dualism is deeply entrenched in the interpretation of Plato, and for good reason. It makes his ethics and theology intelligible.

In the end, I think that Carone offers numerous insights on particular passages in Plato's dialogues, but not a satisfying, unified interpretation. I do not see how I am to derive a particular ethical theory, let alone a cosmology, from her discussion of these particular passages in these four works. The problem with her interpretation, I believe, stems from her methodology. Carone is primarily an analytical interpreter of Plato. She offers close readings of relatively brief passages of texts, and then tries to show that different passages within a single dialogue or in different dialogues are consistent with each other. Analytical interpretation contrasts with the classical approach of earlier scholars, which draws on ancient authors other than Plato, works other than philosophy, and a broad cultural understanding of ancient Greece in interpreting the Platonic text. For instance, a classical interpreter might draw on parallels in Hesiod and Presocratic philosophy in interpreting the Statesman myth (which I found the least satisfying part of her interpretation).

Both approaches contrast with the philosophical approach to Plato exemplified by the great ancient members of the Platonist tradition, such as Plotinus. These interpreters tried to make sense of Plato's dialogues as philosophy, because his philosophy was theirs. They did not seek to find consistency in Plato's dialogues at the level of precise verbal formula or doctrine, but rather at the level of a general approach to philosophical questions, almost a mindset, that pervades all his works. I do not think that philosophical interpretation requires belief, but I think it requires philosophical sympathy. It is difficult for philosophers today to be sympathetic to Plato in this way because his cosmological and ethical vision is alien to the spirit of much contemporary philosophy.

The analytical approach has proved its worth over the past half century, and Carone uses its methods to draw insight from Plato's dialogues. She is right to see in Plato's myths key elements of his cosmology. But I do not think that an author who combines myth and metaphor with argument as thoroughly as does Plato, who presents his philosophy with such great literary power, can possibly reveal his secrets fully to the analytical approach. It must be supplemented by the classical and the philosophical approach if the full significance of Plato's thought is to be appreciated.

Plato's cosmological thought, in a nutshell, is this: the universe is governed by a rational Mind that orders it as much as possible by rational principles. These principles govern motions, cosmic and psychological, that are cyclical. The human soul is rational, but also in some sense "fallen," for it inhabits our earthly bodies rather than the celestial realm. Humans who understand the workings of the cosmos become not just spectators of, but participants in, divine reason and can ascend to the heavenly realm and attain again the divine vision. In order to do this, souls must live ethical lives. Ethics is inextricably connected with teleology and the return of the soul to its home. This overall scheme is the necessary interpretive background for the texts Carone discusses.

This philosophy is alien to the dominant currents in analytical philosophy today, as I have said. The task of the contemporary interpreter, though, is to convince the reader to take Plato's thought seriously as philosophy, even if, in the end, the contemporary interpreter finds this philosophy unacceptable. One way to do this would be to explore the deep affinities between Plato and Christian cosmology. Carone eschews this approach, and I do not see that she makes up this deficit in other ways. The result is, I fear, that Plato's cosmology and his cosmological ethics appear to be primarily of interest only to scholars.