Plato's Cratylus

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David Sedley, Plato's Cratylus, Cambridge University Press, 2003, 173pp, $60.00 (hbk). ISBN 0521584922.

Reviewed by Victor Caston, University of California, Davis


David Sedley’s study of Plato’s Cratylus is an elegant and engaging book. Throughout it exhibits the sure touch of a master. His main thesis is an attractive one, the overall argument systematic and comprehensive, and each page contains gems on particular passages and Plato more generally. It is also wonderfully refreshing to read. This might seem surprising given its main focus, Plato’s examination of etymologies. But the etymologies are central to the dialogue — they take up nearly half of it — and any responsible commentator has to explain why Plato expends this effort. The challenge has always been to do this in a compelling way, and Sedley does a truly impressive job. His approach is strategic: he sets his sights firmly on the forest, while still managing to say a great deal of interest about particular trees.

Like another recent commentator,1 Sedley defends the view that Plato is entirely serious about the etymologies. If it was all a joke, it was a very poor one and no one in antiquity got it — they accepted the etymologies as good ones. It is true that Plato has a good deal of fun throughout the dialogue. But according to Sedley it always revolves around casting Socrates as the expert (appropriately enough, given his professions of ignorance). The fact that the etymologies look ridiculous by modern standards only points up how different his project was. It rests on the assumption, widely shared in antiquity, that words were deliberately coined in order to describe features of the world. Sedley makes an insightful comparison with modern acronyms (36): an acronym is a name formed out of letters from a longer phrase that encapsulates its meaning; if we decode these components correctly, we can recover the original intent of the namegivers, and hence their beliefs about the object named. This leaves room for etymology to play a positive role in acquiring knowledge about the world. If the original namegivers were in a privileged epistemic position, then, whether or not they were infallible, recovering their beliefs would be useful for finding about the world. Plato thinks that the namegivers had deep insights into certain areas of philosophical interest, such as cosmology. But they were not infallible (see especially 436ae): in ethics, for example, they shared the errors of their contemporaries. Plato thus adopts a measured, but genuinely optimistic view of etymology.2 The first two chapters of the book address framework issues. Chapter 1 is concerned with genre, date, and historicity. Sedley argues that what we have is a second or later edition (7–16), revised by Plato, but which is also the record of his own internal dialogue, a transcript of “Plato thinking aloud” (1). It is in any case a tribute to his earlier teacher, and an autobiographical account of Cratylus’ influence. In chapter 2, Sedley explores Plato’s interest in etymology throughout the corpus, and the ways in which ancient etymological practice differs from modern. He distinguishes between an etymology being “exegetically correct” (accurately capturing the beliefs of the namegivers) and being “philosophically correct” (accurately depicting the world), and maintains that Plato is only committed to the former (28). He also argues that Plato would have regarded etymology as something that “fully accords with scientific practice,” even if not explicitly described as a technê (41–50).

The remainder of the chapters follow the order of the dialogue. Chapter 3 treats the conventionalism of Hermogenes, one of the main interlocuters, as common sense, rather than theory (51–8). In examining Socrates’ discussion of names as “instructive,” Sedley takes reference, description, and analysis all to be involved (59–66). This chapter ends with a nuanced and judicious discussion of the dialogue’s relation to the opposition between nomos and physis (66–74). Chapter 4 sets out the main semantic principles Socrates develops. Names are a tool for “separating the being” of the objects named, and so each name must be understood by reference to its function. But just as the same tool can be embodied in different materials, so different strings of sounds (whether in the same or in different languages) can all embody the same name, even if they encapsulate different descriptions. Hence, x and y can be instances of the same name without being intensionally equivalent or strictly synonymous. Plato requires only that they be extensionally equivalent. The encapsulated description is simply the means by which a name achieves its function, of separating the being of its object (81–6). Sedley then looks to the organization of the etymologies, which he sees as systematically canvassing the objects of philosophical investigation. The first half is devoted to theological and cosmological names, and the etymologies resonate with Platonic themes concerning the governing role of reason in the cosmic order (86–98). In chapter 5, Sedley turns to another major theme, namely, flux. In the cosmological etymologies, the emphasis is on the order and measure present in change (103–8). But in the subsequent ethical and psychological etymologies, the instability of the sensible world is projected on to values themselves and the cognitive states concerned with them; and here the namegivers were in error (113–22). Plato accepts that the sensible world is constantly changing, at least “aspectually,” and that our judgements about it must always be open to revision; accordingly, they lack the stability required of knowledge (101–3). But he does not think that this applies to ethical values themselves or our knowledge of them. (108–13).

Chapter 6 begins with the resemblance theory of meaning introduced at 421d ff. Sedley sees this theory as part of Socrates’ etymological theory, rather than a replacement of it. By its very nature, etymology derives the descriptive content of a name from the descriptive content of its components. But this cannot go on forever: according to Sedley, Socrates explicitly rejects coherentist views at 436cd, on the grounds that coherence is compatible with falsehood. If, on the other hand, they trace back to certain ultimate elements or roots, their content cannot be arbitrary or a matter of convention, given Socrates’ commitment to some form of naturalism. So etymological explanations must be grounded in some other form of explanation, such as resemblance. This resemblance is then preserved upwards through linguistic constructions. This “Principle of Uniformity” drives the discussion, according to Sedley; the “Principle of Groundedness” is brought in only as support (123–8). Discussion then shifts to the other extreme and Cratylus’ rejection of falsehood. Unlike Protagoras, Sedley argues, Cratylus accepts an objective standard of truth. But anything that fails to meet this standard is not just untrue; it does not count as speech at all. So while all genuine cases of speech will be true, much of what we ordinarily take to be speech will not in fact be genuine speech (132–3). In contrast, Socrates has assumed throughout the dialogue that there are degrees of correctness, and he argues that imitations cannot resemble originals in every respect, without ceasing to be imitations (432a–d). But if there can be imitations without total resemblance, Sedley argues, then analogously there can be imitations even if there is not perfect resemblance along a certain range of characteristics (137–8). A more serious threat to the theory, one might think, is Cratylus’ concession that custom or convention has some role and Socrates’ claim that it always has some role. But Sedley thinks these concessions are quite circumscribed. For likeness is always required too, and convention is subservient to it (138–43). Convention is only needed to “break the deadlock” when there are approximately the same number of like and unlike elements; if the balances tipped more towards dissimilarity, the sounds would no longer constitute a name at all. Hence, this is not a capitulation to conventionalism. Every word in every natural language secures its hold on its object through imitation (143–6).

In the final chapter, Sedley argues that Plato genuinely endorses this moderate form of etymology. Throughout the dialogue, Socrates has consistently maintained that there can be irrelevant or even inappropriate letters, so long as there are enough appropriate ones (147–51). But given that names can contain a good deal of “potentially misleading information,” Sedley rightly asks, why does Plato “retain even a minimal degree of confidence in etymology?” (153) Plato at once regards etymology as “of relatively minor importance,” while remaining “convinced of the powers of etymology” (153–4). Socrates’ dream at the end of the dialogue, Sedley suggests, does not signify a wish or a hope, but, as it does elsewhere, an hypothesis: his intention is to treat the “dream content” as if it were true, viz., the view that there is such a thing as the beautiful itself, the good itself and so on. Although the “classical theory of Forms” is in view here, Sedley claims, the arguments do not presuppose it. To make sense of them, we need only assume that they are not about predication in general, but self-predication: about whether it will always be true to say of the Beautiful itself that it is beautiful, and so on. Plato, he argues, took this assumption to be self-evident and not dependent on the theory of Forms. Since a predication takes time, a totally unstable object could not be the subject of “even the most self-guaranteeing of all predications” or have any being at all; nor could it be known, if knowing is propositional. (A triple denial, one might add, reminiscent of Gorgias’ On Not Being.) The conclusion, according to Sedley, is only that the Beautiful itself can never change in that respect (164–71). Socrates does not claim to have refuted total flux, but only to have shown “how unwise” it would be to accept it on the basis of etymologies, advice that the young Plato, but not Cratylus, appears to have taken to heart (171–3).

The greatest resistance Sedley will face, undoubtedly, is the residual suspicion that Plato can’t have been serious about these etymologies. But it is hard to see what more could reasonably be done on that score. Sedley has offered a comprehensive explanation of how such etymologies fit within their historical context, within Plato’s body of work, and most importantly within the argument of the Cratylus itself. If there had been any burden of proof, it is clear that this more than answers it. The pertinent question, then, is not one of general orientation, but whether this strategy really makes the best sense of the individual parts of the dialogue. And here, as with any interpretation, there are points on which one might reasonably disagree. The argument against a coherentist interpretation, for example, does not deliver a fatal blow. The fact that consistency is compatible with falsehood (436cd) only shows that consistency is not sufficient for truth. But it is not clear that a coherentist interpretation need be committed to that. The threatened regress at 421–2 does not concern consistency, but stronger, explanatory relations (specifically, etymological derivations); and even then, Plato does not think that such relations ensure truth — that, after all, is one of the things that distinguishes Socrates’ position from Cratylus’. More important is the interpretation of 435ac. Sedley maintains that the appeal to convention does not undermine resemblance, but rather supports it, because in any genuine name, there will never be more dissimilarity than similarity, and convention is only needed to boost similarity when it is not preponderant. The worst case he examines is sklêrotês, where the similar and dissilimar elements are equal. But at 435bd, when Socrates states the concessions that must be made to convention, he ends by canvassing the range of things “spoken,” from those where all or most sounds are similar to the opposite sort of case (tounantion, 435d1). And though he regards the former as best and the latter as worst, both are cases of genuine speech. Now, ordinarily we would not assume that the “opposite” case is one where there is an equal balance of similarity and dissimilarity. The opposite, surely, is where “all or most” of the sounds are dissimilar. So even if sklêrotês is the worst example Socrates examines, it does not look like it is a limiting case, as Sedley claims. But then convention can play a more substantive role than he allows; and if that is right, etymology is an even frailer reed than advertised. This leads us back to Sedley’s earlier question. Given this understanding of etymology, why would Plato have remained so invested in it, apart from sentimental reasons?


1. See Rachel Barney’s excellent Names and Nature in Plato’s Cratylus (Routledge, 2001).

2. In this respect, his portrayal differs from that of Barney.