Plato's Introduction of Forms

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R. M. Dancy, Plato's Introduction of Forms, Cambridge University Press, 2004, 348pp., $75.00 (hbk), ISBN 0521838010.

Reviewed by Donald Zeyl, University of Rhode Island


The aim of this impressive book is to establish, by means of close-textured logical analysis of the texts it examines, the thesis that the Theory of Forms that emerges in Plato's middle dialogues is rooted in a "Socratic" theory of definition discernible in the early dialogues. This thesis is by no means new. But it has never been as rigorously and exhaustively examined and defended as it is in this book. In the course of pursuing his aim, Dancy develops and defends his own views on the multiple interpretive issues that emerge from the examination; while many of these views are widely shared, some are fairly unorthodox. His style is unfailingly clear, brisk and engaging, and readers familiar with the textual terrain and sympathetic to his approach will find this book a dense but compelling read.

The book's introduction immediately places the reader before two major dividing lines in the contemporary study of Plato's dialogues. The first is the division between those who advocate a "literary" study of the dialogues as against those who favor an "analytic" approach; the second between those who claim to see no major changes in doctrine over the course of Plato's literary life ("unitarians") and those who claim the opposite ("developmentalists"). Without apology and without prejudice to those who opt differently, Dancy places his project unequivocally within the "analytic" and "developmental" camps. Similarly (and nowadays more controversially), he embraces the view of Vlastos and others that there are good reasons (Aristotle's testimony being the chief) to ascribe to the historical Socrates the theory of definition detected in the early dialogues, though he rightly points out that his thesis neither stands nor falls on that point. The introduction concludes with a study of a composite Aristotelian account concerning the genesis of the Theory of Forms. In the Metaphysics Aristotle attributes to Plato an "Argument from Flux" for the existence of separate Forms, and Dancy finds in an important argument of the Phaedo (74a-c) an "Argument from Relativity" that remarkably parallels -- indeed, he argues, it is identical with (p. 18) -- this Argument from Flux. This and other arguments in the Phaedo and the Symposium will be shown to depend upon certain requirements for correct definitions previously articulated in the early dialogues, and it is the burden of the book to show first exactly how these requirements operate in the Platonic Socrates' project of examining proposed definitions there, and second how the Theory of Forms of the middle dialogues both employs and extends these requirements.

The main body of the book is divided into three parts. In Part I -- by far the longest (seven chapters, 183 pages) -- Dancy explores the gamut of definitional arguments in the early dialogues. The constituent propositions of those arguments are parsed into logical form, and the logical relations among them are carefully explored. The result is a sophisticated and thoroughgoing logical analysis of those arguments. The analysis is used to identify and track the use of the key requirements of a "Socratic theory of definition."

The first two chapters of Part I address various preliminary issues. In Chapter 2, after some prefatory comments on the notion of definition and a survey of the various texts that relate knowledge of definitions to right living, Dancy turns to the passages and finds the Socrates of the early dialogues committed to the "Intellectualist Assumption" (IA): to know whether something is F one must know (and be able to say) what F-ness is. Other commentators have sought to acquit Socrates of the "Socratic Fallacy" (as the predicament that this assumption puts Socrates into is generally known), but Dancy demurs. He argues that Socrates indeed makes the assumption, and that it indeed sabotages the success of his search for definitions. This assumption must be dropped if the search is to be rehabilitated, and he observes the drop to occur in the Meno (more on that below).

Chapter 3 examines the status of Socratic definienda: when Socrates and his interlocutor agree that, say, piety exists, and they go on to reach further agreements about it -- for example, that its presence is what makes pious things pious -- they are not doing metaphysics. Dancy emphatically disagrees with those who find metaphysics in the early dialogues, including those who detect an "early" (metaphysical) theory of "Socratic" forms there. He does not, however, explicitly identify and defend criteria that distinguish non-metaphysical talk from metaphysics; he appears to think that if a claim is intelligible to philosophically naïve interlocutors and accepted by them as obviously true it is not metaphysical. This assumption of a dichotomy between "ordinary language" and metaphysics is of long-standing lineage, but it is open to question.

The four chapters that follow (Chapters 4-7) identify the requirements of Socratic definition and show how these are deployed in the search. These requirements are (1) substitutivity, (2) paradigms, and (3) explanation. The latter two combine to yield (4) explaining by paradigms.

Substitutivity (Chapter 4) requires that definiendum and definiens must be intersubstitutable salva veritate. This requirement is satisfied when either (in cases where the definiendum occupies the predicate position in a sentence) the definiens supplies both necessary and sufficient conditions for the application of the definiendum or (in cases where it occupies the subject position) the relation between them conforms to Leibniz' Law. So roughly: (1) F-ness =df abc entails that x is F if and only if x is abc, and (2) F-ness =df abc entails that F-ness is G if and only if abc is G. Relevant texts in the Laches, Charmides, Lysis and Euthyphro are analyzed to show that Socrates or his interlocutor(s) explicitly or tacitly appeal to the former, while several passages in the Charmides show that they deploy the latter version of the requirement.

Secondly, Socrates requires definientia to be paradigms (paradeigmata, Chapter 5): a definiens functions as a standard against which putative instances of a definiendum are measured to determine by comparison whether in fact they are or are not real instances. But (notoriously for the middle dialogues but -- as Dancy has it -- innocently for the early) this requirement introduces the phenomenon of self-predication: the standard against which putative cases of F are measured must itself invariably exemplify F-ness and never the contrary of F-ness. Texts in the Hippias Major (which Dancy takes to be authentic) and the Euthyphro show this requirement to be in play.

The third requirement is that a definiens should explain what it is about cases of the definiendum that "makes" them such (Chapter 6): x is F because it is abc. This requirement cannot comply with the substitutivity requirement, for the obvious reason that the "because (of)" relation is not symmetrical; clearly the substitutivity requirement cannot be met in "because" contexts: if x is F because it is abc, it is not the case that x is abc because it is F. So if Socrates were to apply substitutivity in an explanatory context, he would be committing a serious error. In a detailed analysis of the complicated argument at Euthyphro 9d-11b, Dancy shows how Socrates effectively refutes the definition under consideration by appealing to non-substitutivity in "because" contexts, yet himself falls victim to violating it in his concluding summation of the argument.

While it is possible in contexts like the Euthyphro to construe non-causally the explanatory role of the definiens, there are passages in other early dialogues, in the Protagoras, Charmides, and most notably the Hippias Major, in which the paradigm requirement is fused with the explanatory requirement, and causal efficacy begins to come into play: whatever "makes" things F must itself be F, and by making things F it "transmits" its F-ness to those things (Chapter 7). The Theory of Forms of the middle dialogues is a "super-strong transmission theory." In the early dialogues, by contrast, the idea that whatever makes things F must itself be F is treated as a truism with which "anyone on the street would agree" (and thus, in Dancy's view, carries no metaphysical weight).

Chapter 8 explores the language of the early dialogues that suggest the relation between the things that are F and the F-ness because of which they are F. Already there one encounters expressions like "being present to or in" (pareinai, eneinai, etc.), "partaking of" (metechein) and "participating in" (metalambanein) that become terms of art in the middle period Theory of Forms. In many contexts the presence, etc. of F-ness to or in x is such that F-ness "transmits" its character to x. Again, the language suggests a "transmission theory" that in Dancy's view remains metaphysically innocuous in the early dialogues, but anticipates the metaphysically laden use of these expressions in the middle dialogues.

The second part of the book, consisting of a single chapter (Chapter 9), focuses on the Meno, which Dancy, following the standard view, characterizes as a "transitional" dialogue. In the first part (70a-80d) Socrates pursues a definition of virtue in the familiar way. This passage contributes a new requirement, the "unity requirement": a definiens for F must indicate the one "form" (eidos) by virtue of which all things F are similar in respect of being F. This requirement, according to Dancy, brings the Socratic project of the earlier dialogues "a step closer" (p. 215) to the middle period Theory of Forms. He next examines Meno's Paradox and the theory of Recollection given in response to it, as well the demonstration with the slave boy. His account here is primarily interpretive rather than analytical, and it is not clear how he takes these topics to relate to the main project of showing the progression of the Socratic theory of definition. His discussion of the "method of hypothesis" (86c-89) has significance for his project, in that he takes the passage to retract the "Intellectualist Assumption" made in the earlier dialogues. But this seems mistaken. What the passage retracts is the declaration made at the outset of the dialogue that to know whether x is F one must know what x is. This is not the same as the assumption (IA), according to which to know whether x is F one must know what F-ness is. Whether or not we agree that IA is in play in the early dialogues, we should not agree that it is what is given up here. Dancy sums up the contribution of the Meno to the story he wants to tell as follows: Although the "unity requirement" for proper definitions represents movement toward unitary Forms, and although the word "form" (eidos) is used to characterize the object of the quest for definition, these developments still need not be taken to imply the full-blown Theory of Forms. There is nothing in the Meno's account of Recollection that requires the metaphysical entities familiar from the middle dialogues to be in place for service as the objects recollected.

The third part of the book consists of four concluding chapters (Chapters 10-13) that examine the introduction of the middle-period Theory of Forms in the Phaedo and the Symposium. The Forms make their entry at Phaedo 65d. Their introduction there (fully discussed in Chapter 10) as variations of "the F itself" does not as such take us beyond the early dialogues, but their characterization as non-perceptible entities does. The distinctness of Forms from their instances -- purportedly proven by the Argument from Relativity at 74a-c (see Chapter 11) with its crucial premise that while all F-instances are always also the contrary of F, the F itself is never contrary-F -- and the consequent claim that our knowledge of the F itself predates our perceptual experiences of F-instances show that a full-blown metaphysical theory is now on the table. The systematic contrasts between the Beautiful and other beautiful things drawn by Diotima in the Symposium (210d-211b, discussed in Chapter 12), give further expression to the crucial premise of the Phaedo's Argument from Relativity. And finally, the role of the Forms as causes of their participants' possessing at least some of the properties they possess (Chapter 13), "transmitting" their properties to their participants, is proposed as an alternative to the causal theories that Socrates had come to reject (the "mechanistic" account of causation) or had found elusive (teleological accounts), thus fixing it as a more full-blown Transmission Theory than that found in the early dialogues (see Chapter 7).

I would like to conclude with two comments.

First, as stated earlier, I worry about the lack of attention given to the question as to what counts as a metaphysical theory, and what distinguishes such a theory from one that isn't metaphysical. That distinction is crucial to Dancy's overall argument, yet it seems assumed without much support. Why, one might wonder, should a philosophically naïve interlocutor be incapable of understanding a metaphysical proposition? Second, the book cuts a wide swath through the Platonic texts -- arguably wider than what is required by the author's stated project. Many passages that do not relate directly to that project receive as much and as detailed attention as those that do. For example, it is not clear how the expansive treatments of Recollection, both in the Meno and in the Phaedo help settle questions about the status of the objects of definition in that dialogue and the requirements of the enterprise of searching for them. The impression one gets is that Dancy's unstated objective in this book is just to offer up a comprehensive logical analysis of all of the metaphysical (including "pre-metaphysical") and epistemological arguments of Plato's dialogues up to the Republic. This comprehensive project is certainly a worthwhile undertaking, and he does a superb job of it. We are told that Dancy's original intent was to include the Republic within the scope of his study (p. xi). That intent might have been achieved if the range of the passages analyzed in the book had been confined to those required by the scope of his thesis.

This is clearly a study that raises the bar for the analytic approach to the study of Plato's dialogues. That approach is less in fashion these days than it was only a few decades ago, and I am afraid that those out of sympathy with the approach may come to regard the book as the embodiment of all they find objectionable. But among those who believe the analytic approach continues to be both illuminating and exciting, the book deserves and will garner high esteem. It will influence the study of its subject matter for decades to come. There is an occasional hint that a sequel may be in the works; if so, we have good reason to wish the author well during the gestation period and to celebrate its arrival in due time.

The book concludes with an ample bibliography, an index of passages cited, and a general index. The last of these, however, consists mostly of entries of the names of authors cited; the topical component is sparse and ought to be expanded in future printings.