Plato's Laws: A Critical Guide

Placeholder book cover

Christopher Bobonich (ed.), Plato's Laws: A Critical Guide, Cambridge University Press, 2010, 245pp., $80.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780521884631.

Reviewed by Luc Brisson, CNRS, Paris-Villejuif


This book contains eleven essays. The first one is by Malcolm Schofield, who investigates Plato's project in the Laws. This project is, he claims, twofold: to propose a second-rank constitution that would exhibit more realism than that of the Republic, and to construct a philosophical system that would be a "mixed constitution", associating freedom and authority, and in which, consequently, the laws are preceded by persuasive preludes. Christopher Rowe then inquires whom the Laws were intended for. Unlike the Republic, one finds many fewer philosophical terms and theoretical developments in this last dialogue, where authority is situated in the laws rather than in the philosophers' knowledge. Thus, the Laws were intended for three types of audience: non-philosophers such as Clinias and Megillos, colonists, and philosophers -- familiar with the Republic and other dialogues -- interested in practical matters: in other words, those who attended the Academy.

The following three essays deal with the question of virtue (areté). In the first, Richard Kraut opposes a thesis set forth by Bobonich (2002). The virtue of the ordinary citizen in the Laws, although it fails to achieve the level of that of the elites who govern the city, must, like the virtue of the producers of the Republic, be considered genuine virtue, not the servile kind criticized at Phaedo 69b. Julia Annas agrees with Kraut on this point, but she wonders what leads the average citizen to obey the law. Plato thinks preambles must incite people to obey the law, by means of persuasion. Yet what meaning should be attributed to the preambles? Annas rejects three interpretations: 1) the preambles serve to provide the law with a rational justification; 2) they affect the non-rational part of the citizens' souls; and 3) they simply replace the law. Since she does not accept any of these interpretations, Annas refers to the way Philo, who was influenced by Plato's Laws, interprets the Mosaic Law: the law must express the ethical goals it pursues, and this is the goal of preambles. Terence Irwin, relying primarily on Cicero, insists on the definition of the law mentioned at I 644d: an internal natural law that renders one capable of resisting pain and discomfort. This kind of law is different from the one constituted by the laws of the city insofar as it can be discovered by all, and therefore does not require the knowledge of experts. Such a law can be assimilated to Kant's "moral law", which is inscribed in our hearts.

The next three essays take up subjects of moral psychology. Dorothea Frede inquires into the role of pleasure in the Laws. Plato does not propose a theory of pleasure, but limits himself, particularly in his puppet comparison, to pointing out the instability of a harmonious relation between reason and pleasure in the ordinary citizen. This is why he insists so much on the role of education, which is intended to ensure and maintain this balance. This education is pursued throughout one's life, especially on the occasion of religious festivals, where songs and dances habituate the citizen to controlling pleasure. Rachana Kamtekar investigates the nature and role of non-rational motivation, at least during the first part of life. If Plato prescribes physical activities in the Laws, it is because he considers psychological activity as a kind of motion, in conformity with the tripartition of the soul found in the Republic and the Timaeus. The non-rational parts of the soul exhibit genuine autonomy on the level of motivations, and the physical activities they inspire provide the rational part of the soul with examples of the order that must characterize it. Along the same lines, Bobonich inquires into non-rational motivations in the Timaeus and the Laws. Since he considers that some non-rational motivations may have a rational content, he opposes Lorenz (2009), for whom the content of non-rational desires depends on images rather than reason. As he has shown (2002), therefore, Bobonich maintains that according to the moral psychology Plato develops in the Timaeus and the Laws, non-rational motivations cannot be exercised independently of reason.

The last three essays are devoted to specific institutions. Thanassis Samaras focuses on the institutions associated with the family, inquiring in particular into the status of women. Women enjoy formal political equality, but the organization of the oikos makes the real exercise of these rights problematic. Robert Mayhew studies theology in the Laws, taking into consideration not only Book 10, but also books 4 and 5. The resulting impression on this level is one of vagueness, which can be explained, according to the author, by the difficulty of a scientific theology, and by Plato's desire to avoid precipitating the citizens into obscure research that would lead them to doubt. Finally, in an article published in a French version in the Mélanges Bollack, André Laks investigates the famous remark in book 7 according to which the Laws constitute the truest tragedy. The Laws are in fact a true tragedy, for they feature an unavoidable conflict between the legislative ideal, involving rational persuasion, and the need for recourse to punishment in order to achieve obedience to the law.

This book is technically very well made. It includes a bibliography and a general index, but no index locorum.

On the whole, these essays are very well argued, but they reflect exclusively the interests in the Laws on the part of the Anglo-Saxon world. One will not find here any elaborate discussion concerning the viewpoints defended in any tradition other than that represented in England and the United States: there is no mention of the extensive work carried out over the last few years in Germany, Spain, Italy and France. The only philosophical aspect really taken into account is that which concerns politics and moral psychology, often from an Aristotelian, Stoic, and even Kantian perspective. One also finds practically nothing on the historical context in which the Laws are rooted, on the economic and social organization of the city of the Magnesians, on its institutions (particularly magistracies, education in the broad sense, banquets, religious festivals, and so on), on legislation in the broad sense, or on specific laws. This twofold closure, with regard to the outside world and to non-philosophical questions, subtracts a great deal of interest from this work which claims to be A Critical Guide, but is in fact anything but a critical guide. It does not even contain a mention of the bibliography collected by Trevor Saunders and published by Luc Brisson (2000).

In fact, this book is made up of a series of essays whose presence is justified, in large part, by their reference to Bobonich (2002). This is obviously the case for the articles dealing with the question of virtue and moral psychology. It is also the case for the articles on the family, the gods, and tragedy, which boil down to the question of the preambles. Only the essays by Schofield and Rowe broaden the field of research.


Bobonich, Christopher. 2002. Plato's Utopia Recast: His Later Ethics and Politics. Clarendon Press.

Lorenz, Hendrik. 2009. The Brute Within: Appetitive Desire in Plato and Aristotle. Oxford University Press.

Saunders, Trevor and Luc Brisson. 2000. Bibliography on Plato's Laws (3rd Edition). Revised and Completed with an Additional Bibliography on the Epinomis by Luc Brisson. IPS vol. 12, Sankt Augustin. Academia Verlag.