Plato's Laws: Force and Truth in Politics

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Gregory Recco and Eric Sanday (eds.), Plato's Laws: Force and Truth in Politics, Indiana University Press, 2013, 248pp., ISBN 9780253001825.

Reviewed by Antony Hatzistavrou, University of Hull


Recent years have seen a revival of interest in Plato's Laws. A comprehensive study of the political philosophy of the dialogue has been published (Christopher Bobonich's Plato's Utopia Recast), an excellent collection of essays as part of Cambridge Critical Studies Series has also appeared, and a new translation for the Cambridge Texts in the History of Political Thought series is currently being prepared for publication. Recco and Sanday's edited volume is part of this developing interest in the study of Plato's last dialogue.

The study of the Laws is a rather challenging scholarly enterprise for at least two reasons. The first is that the structure of the dialogue is unclear and its dialectic difficult to follow. There are gaps, unexpected shifts in discussion, sudden digressions and unfinished arguments. The second reason relates to the place of the dialogue in the context of Plato's political philosophy as a whole and more specifically its relation to the other two main 'political' dialogues of Plato, the Republic and the Statesman. Does it continue a coherent political project or does it mark a late shift in Plato's thought about the organisation of political affairs? For example, does the authoritarianism of the Republic and the Statesman survive unhindered or is it tamed or even abandoned? Readers of Recco and Sanday's collection will find scholarly attempts to grapple both with the structure of the Laws and with its overall political message.

The methodology or, say more loosely, the 'style' of this collection is somewhat difficult to properly characterize. It appears in a series of 'Studies in Continental Thought', edited by one of the contributors (John Sallis). Describing, however, its style as 'continental' is not particularly illuminating because it is not clear what 'continental' may signify in this context. One can say though that the emphasis is less on the extraction from the text of the Laws and study of philosophical arguments and more on the reconstruction of the internal dialectic of the dialogue and the development of its major 'themes'.

There are an introduction and fourteen essays, a bibliography and an index (though not an index of passages). The first two essays are classified as 'synopses' and provide brief surveys, the first of the structure of the dialogue and the second of its historical context. The other twelve essays are on individual books of the Laws (Book 4 is the focus of two essays while Books 11 and 12 are discussed in a single essay) and are labeled 'readings'. All the essays were written for the volume with the exception of Sara Brill's, parts of which were previously published.

Mitchell Miller, in the first of the two 'synoptic' essays, offers some challenging suggestions about the overall structure of the Laws and explores the possibility of a holistic interpretation of the dialogue through a careful reading of some key passages. This is a strong and imaginative essay. Mark Munn, in the second of the 'synoptic' essays, explores the historical context of the Laws. The second part of his essay focuses on the political implications of the rhetoric of eros, which Munn takes to reflect a political ideology in conflict with the Athenian imperialism prevalent in the time of Plato's youth.

In the third essay (and the first one of the 'readings'), Eric Salem focuses on Book 1 and tries to explain the lack of a philosophically focused and rigorous discussion about laws among the Athenian stranger, Megillus and Cleinias. He argues inter alia that the character and preconceptions of the two interlocutors of the Athenian stranger are obstacles to dispassionate philosophical inquiry and that the discussion in Book 1 is shaped by attempts of the Athenian stranger to find a ground for a common inquiry. In the fourth essay, John Russon focuses on the account of education described in Book 2 and analyzes its principles. He argues that there are conflicts primarily between the oppressive character of some educational proposals and the openness of some educational principles contained in the second book (though it remains unclear why the interlocutors in the dialogue remain oblivious to the alleged conflicts). In the fifth essay, John Sallis provides an overview of the Book 3. This is the least 'scholarly' of the essays since there is no direct engagement with the relevant secondary literature (there are not any notes either).

In his contribution, Michael Zuckert provides a detailed analysis of basic themes in Book 4. This is one of the best essays; it contains a wealth of interesting interpretative suggestions of key passages and some sober remarks about the authoritarian character of the legislative project in the Laws. Zuckert argues contra some current interpretations that the introduction of preludes to the laws does not diminish their coercive nature. Book 4 is also the subject of Patricia Fagan's essay. She focuses on its opening and explores (through drawing some comparisons with the landscape that the Cyclopes inhabit in the Odyssey) the implications of the terrain of the new city for its constitution. She argues that the landscape of the new city in Book 4 relates to the hostility of its constitution towards strangers, which is in sharp contrast with its openness towards the gods who give it its laws.

Robert Metcalf provides an overview of the prelude in Book 5 and comments on some relevant key passages. He also raises concerns about its persuasive power, especially with regard to its sermon like character, and contends that dialogical argumentative exchanges are more likely to persuade the readers of the Laws. Recco's essay focuses on the Athenian stranger's principle of equality and its use in the distribution of political offices in Book 6. He argues that the Athenian stranger reaches a rather unhappy compromise between proportionate and numerical equality in order to avoid factional strife in the city.

The starting point of David Roochnik's interesting and cleverly written essay is the Athenian stranger's claim in Book 7 that while human affairs do not deserve to be treated in a serious manner it is necessary that one be serious about them (803b). After dismissing the suggestion that the Athenian stranger fakes an interest in human affairs, Roochnik tries to explain how it is possible for the Athenian stranger to treat human affairs in a serious manner given that he admits that they do not deserve serious treatment. Roochnik argues that, on the one hand, the necessity to treat human affairs seriously may be construed as a tragic element of the human predicament, and, on the other hand, the proper perspective of treating human affairs must involve a dose of self-ridicule characteristic of comedy. The Athenian stranger's discussion of some elements of legislation exemplifies this perspective.

Francisco Gonzalez discusses a small part of Book 8 that focuses on the regulation of sexual conduct. Gonzalez provides a close reading of the relevant text, which reveals its internal tensions and inconsistencies, and concludes with some radical suggestions about how the power of eros may undermine the project of legislation in the Laws. Catherine Zuckert argues that the Laws should not be read as containing a project of legislation at all but rather as having a primarily educational objective, namely, teaching its readers how to become legislators. This educational process is assisted through the use of arguments that fall short of the standards of proper philosophical reasoning and are thus best considered 'quasi-philosophical'. Zuckert develops her novel interpretation through examining passages of Book 9 and developing contrasts between the Laws, on the one hand, and the Republic and the Statesman, on the other.

Sara Brill focuses on the preludes against impiety and explains their therapeutic function by reference to the account of the soul and the cosmology described in Book 10. Brill's essay is rich in interpretative insights and offers a compelling interpretation of the prosthetic character of law. In the final chapter of the collection, Sanday discusses the last two books of the Laws and argues that they play an important role in the development of the Laws. They complete the discussion of impiety started in Book 10 by focusing on the institutional impiety of the second-best city, which relates to its material foundations and the role money and property play in its context.

The collection as a whole is characterized by a significant degree of cohesion, certainly greater than is the norm in collections of essays. The contributors engage with one another's arguments, and there are frequent cross-references that help the reader follow the nuances of relevant scholarly debates. However, the division of the essays into 'synopses' and 'readings' of individual books of the Laws works less well. The problem is that the purpose of the readings remains ambivalent. Instead of providing overviews of, or commentaries on, the structure and content of individual books, quite a few of the 'readings' focus on themes (like education or eros) that run through more than one book of the Laws. The authors make attempts to anchor the discussion of such themes on individual books in line with the book-based structure of the 'readings', but one is left with the impression that some essays would have fitted better with a theme-based structure.