Plato's Meno: An Interpretation

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Cristina Ionescu, Plato's Meno: An Interpretation, Lexington Books, 2007, 194 pp., $65.00 (hbk), ISBN 0739120255.

Reviewed by Debra Nails, Michigan State University


The historical Meno was so vicious in so many ways that even his fellow mercenary, Xenophon, applauds his being tortured for a year and then executed horribly.  The historical Anytus, Meno's Athenian host, flip-flopped politically, invented a new form of jury bribery, and became one of Socrates' accusers.  Plato must have had some sense of humor to set a conversation on virtue between Socrates and those two reprobates.  If it weren't for what Leibniz called Plato's "beautiful experiment" with Meno's intelligent slave ('boy' is a misnomer), one might wonder whether the Meno is really about virtue at all, rather than about philosophical inquiry or something else.  No wonder Plato's Meno is so often assigned; no wonder books on the dialogue keep rolling off the presses.

Cristina Ionescu's Plato's Meno:  An Interpretation is the latest of these:  a short, straightforward companion to the dialogue, using the author's own translations, evenhandedly noting selections from a century of scholarship across philosophical schools of interpretation, and digressing occasionally to provide background information from myth, culture, presocratics, and other Platonic dialogues.  Neither comprehensive in interpretation nor fine in analysis, the book is a commentary, the revision of Ionescu's 2005 doctoral dissertation, written under the direction of Kenneth Dorter at the University of Guelph.  Its tone is resolutely conflict-averse; its style is descriptive summary with discussion, but it also specifies what the characters' beliefs are, what they intend to convey and why, and what Plato intends his readers to understand.  Were we to avert our eyes from the notes consigned to the ends of the chapters,[1] we might mistake the book for a seamless exposition of a relatively uncontroversial Platonic dialogue, concluding overall that virtue is wisdom or some sort of knowledge (153).

The book contains a brief introduction and three chapters that address the three parts of the dialogue.  In the introduction, Ionescu presents her assumptions without argument.  Two of these in particular have repercussions later in her book.  The first is a commitment to developmentalism, the view that the order of composition of the dialogues is well enough established that Plato's own philosophical development can be pinned down to that chronology; the second is that the Meno is transitional between the early and middle dialogues.  Acknowledging that scholars disagree over the details of the transition, which it is not the purpose of her book to discuss, she will "nonetheless attempt to reveal what the Meno discloses in this regard" (xii).  She then identifies three developmental considerations:  thematic (Plato moves away from ethics, toward epistemology, ontology, and metaphysics); dramatic (away from refutation, toward construction, and away from the historical Socrates, toward "Socrates as mouthpiece"); and methodological (away from elenchus, toward hypothesis and collection-division).  These considerations do not reemerge explicitly, however, because the transitional position of Meno, asserted as fact, is also Ionescu's solution to the well-known problem of the unity of the dialogue, namely, that "the Meno enacts" transition by refining early elements, not replacing them.

Chapter I, "Socratic Elenchus and the Quest for the Essence of Virtue," shows that the first part of the dialogue is mostly early in all three ways.  'Essence' and occasionally 'definition' are used interchangeably for the Socratic terms eidos, ousia, and sometimes ti, which Ionescu takes to mean "a universal explanatory account or cause of a thing's being what it is" (xvi, 13), though their referents are the same Platonic forms that, later in the dialogue, are implied by both the theory of anamnêsis and mathematics.  Socratic elenchus here tests for coherence, identifying inconsistencies in an ethical domain (cf. p. 143).

Although there are abundant citations, each familiar controversy that Ionescu encounters as she proceeds through the dialogue is treated inoffensively.  The definition of 'schêma' as shape provides an example.  Is shape (a) what accompanies color, 75b9-10, or (b) the limit of a solid, 76a7?  Specifically, when Socrates says one of the answers is better (76e7), which does he mean?  Having named eight supporters of (a) and eight supporters of (b) in her notes, Ionescu offers in her text a paragraph about the sorts of reasons the two groups commonly give for preferring (a) or (b), concluding, "Since most of the remarks on both sides are correct, the superiority of one over the other should be decided on account of their respective relevance in our context … [as] a model for the characterization of virtue" (22).  She finds Klein 1965, who happens to support (a), "insightful" for suggesting the analogy that knowledge is to virtue as shape is to color.  Ionescu adds, "and what limit is to a solid," extending Klein's analogy to (b), thereby obtaining a premise for the dialogue's overall conclusion that virtue is wisdom or some sort of knowledge.  But something else is meanwhile going on in the notes:  she finds Scott 2006, who happens to support (b), "insightful" for arguing that 'schêma' should be translated 'surface' not 'shape' across both (a) and (b).  Ionescu does not infer, as she might have, that Scott's argument, removing inconsistencies between (a) and (b), could provide motivation for the extension she performs; nor does she meet Scott's explicit criticism of Klein's treatment of 'schêma' although Klein's account, specifically his claim that 'schêma' in (b) is a technical term from geometry, arguably undermines her extension (cf. p. 124 where she seems to have embraced Klein's definition).

Chapter II, "Recollection," begins with the paradox of inquiry through a discussion of whether four aspects of Socrates' restatement of Meno's challenge introduce significant modifications.  Ionescu's judgment is No for the first three, though the notes point readers to other estimations from the literature, and Yes for the fourth, Socrates' substitution of the "neutral and universal anthropo [sic] and of the indefinite particle an" for Meno's ad hominem formulation of the paradox.  "Meno's challenge becomes a philosophical problem," she says, "only once it is universalized, freed from irony and sarcasm, and transposed in a different field of presuppositions."  Meno's field is that of atomistic assumptions about knowledge -- wherein the elenchus, combined with the disavowal of knowledge and priority of definition, leads to radical skepticism.  Plato's field, however, is holistic:  the "justification of the possibility of knowledge … in general" (42-44) wherein the same combination of elenchus, disavowal of knowledge, and priority of definition undercuts skepticism by purging inconsistencies and urging the maintenance of only well-fortified opinions.  The justification of the possibility of knowledge is a tall order, only a goal at this point, but it is in fact where Ionescu is aiming when she turns to anamnêsis.

Discussing Plato's device of introducing recollection through myth, Ionescu emphasizes that whereas a myth is required to hold Meno's interest, and may be useful in the way incantations can be useful to persuade the child within, a literal reading is not recommended for accomplished philosophers.  The content of the myth is likewise subject to comprehension at a variety of levels from literal to metaphorical.  These are treated in some detail (49-64, with the rising tally of scholars in notes), invoking facets of Orphic and Pythagorean lore, Empedocles, Greek mythology, and the verses often attributed to Pindar for the literal reading; for the metaphorical-philosophical reading, we are to note the purge of irrationalities (suggesting the elenchus), the discarnate sight of all things (suggesting forms), the kinship of all nature, and the importance of the courageous pursuit of inquiry.  A spark occurs in a note where Ionescu makes an argument against Scott's view, following Popper, that the Meno is egalitarian and cannot account for human differences in ability and achievement, a position Scott bases first on the slave's stated potential to become as knowledgeable of geometry as anyone, but also on Socrates' speaking of nature as inheritance at 89a5-b7.  Ionescu presses two points:  first, she emphasizes that the dialogue's requirement of courageous effort would prevent those who easily tire of inquiry from achieving knowledge.  Second, she finds Scott's understanding of 'nature' too narrow, limited to "genetically inherited inclinations and character types."  While acknowledging that inheritance is natural, and that it can affect one's ability to mount a courageous effort, she stresses rather that the kinship of all nature in the Meno extends to "the ontological status of the human soul and the realities it can in principle grasp."  I would add that 'nature' in that sense must equally include the human body and all the other extended entities that are known, if they are known, by deduction from formal realities.  When Ionescu again invokes the broader meaning of 'nature' in her third chapter for the passage on recognizing goodness-by-nature in newborns (89a5-b7), she is unpersuasive.

Dramatic detail and its interpretation is Ionescu's mainstay.  Her treatment of the geometry lesson rests on a painstaking retelling of the episode, point by point through the slave's learning stages, and then a further retelling under four headings, intended to make clear how "Recollection discloses the metaphysical framework within which application of the hypothetical method or some other systematic dialectical procedure enables us to attain knowledge" (75).  The fourth of these includes an interesting attempt to plot the slave's stages of learning to the divided line of the Republic, thereby opposing the view that the Meno takes mathematical knowledge to be the highest attainable knowledge, and supporting the notion that forms are implicit in the Meno (81-86).  But Ionesco is not in command of the mathematics, which results in her downplaying the role of mathematics in the dialogue.  For example, her first appendix, "The 'Lines through the Middle' in the Slave's Geometrical Problem," considers a variety of scholarly views on whether the lines Socrates draws at 82c2-3 are transversals or diagonals.  Diagonals win by a hair, but Ionescu then comments that the implications of the issue are not so "significant for the overall episode" because the "presence of two levels of consideration (perceptual and conceptual) … holds on either one of the interpretations" (169).  Philosophers are, I concede, more often than not uninformed by the Platonic mathematical literature, much of which appears in journals of the history of mathematics, but Ionesco's treatment of the mathematical issues would have been more useful if she had consulted the sources she found in Scott (or David Fowler's 1999 revision of his The Mathematics of Plato's Academy).

The moral pay-off occurs in the third and final chapter, "The Method of Hypothesis:  Virtue and Knowledge," where the hypothetical method is revealed as the dialectical procedure for converting opinions to knowledge, undermining (Meno's) skepticism.  Ionescu reaches her stride here, setting out her own position in the text against rivals in the notes.  (a) Socrates' use of the hypothetical method, while it has appeared to others to be a concession to Meno, in fact reestablishes Socrates' control over the direction of the search.  (b) Socrates adheres to his maxim of the priority of essence/definition although others have taken him to be abandoning it.  (c) The initial hypothesis is the biconditional "if virtue is some sort of knowledge, then it is teachable, if not, not."  Ionescu devotes her second appendix, "The Initial Hypothesis in the Meno," to a survey of alternative views of what the controversial initial hypothesis is.  The first view drops the second part of Ionescu's biconditional (the "if not, not"); the second is, "Knowledge alone is teachable"; the third, "All that is good is knowledge"; and the fourth, "Virtue is knowledge."  The really interesting issue, unfortunately not pursued, is how and why Weiss 2001, in opposition to almost all other commentators, can have exactly the same biconditional initial hypothesis as Ionescu (175n1) yet derive significantly different implications from it.

The remainder of the chapter guides the reader through five stages of the application of the method, including several arguments formatted as numbered steps, facilitating their exposition.  A result is that Ionescu demonstrates precisely how she reaches her conclusion that virtue is wisdom or some sort of knowledge.  Her far more ambitious aim, as I mentioned, is to make good her view that, with the metaphysical foundation provided by anamnêsis, a dialectical method such as hypothesis can turn true opinions into knowledge in the strong sense.  Sympathetic to the aim, I moved peaceably through stage two, finding the suggested textual links and explanations plausible.  (The third is the newborns passage, mentioned above.)  In the fourth stage, Ionescu does a nice job of establishing that Socrates need not be taken to believe that if there were teachers, virtue would be teachable -- ah, but here begins the slope that may be slippery.  Ionescu has an ingenious idea, pursued through the fourth and fifth stages (121-53) that is reminiscent of the old comic strips with callouts for what He says and She says, but accompanying cloudlike callouts for what He and She are thinking despite their saying the same words.  It will transpire that Meno and Anytus have one set of meanings while Socrates has another, that Meno and Anytus accept some among the premises, and Socrates others.  Ionescu's effort is admirable, but the devil's in the details, details involving camouflaged meanings, hints, Plato's dramatic intentions, Socrates' own need to uncover Meno's fundamental assumptions, a nuanced interpretation of madness and blindness, the tendency of the analogy between virtue and the crafts to dissimilarity, the road to Larissa as an illustrative analogy rather than an instance of knowledge, et al.  Assuming for argument's sake that all the dramatic details are accurate as Ionescu interprets them, that the puzzle is complete in the end, I am left with two spare pieces in my hand.  First, Plato's conception of knowledge is judged "pretty coherent," for what is missing is "the Republic's nonhypothetical, self-validating first principle, the form of the Good" (140-46), which has not yet been elucidated.  In other words, the initial developmentalist assumption has come to the rescue.  Second, true opinions mediate between knowledge and ignorance, but false opinion has slipped out of the discussion altogether (148-51).  I still wind up needing more argument.

This is not an integrated book.  For several reasons, I fault the publisher who failed to require one.  The appearance is that Ionescu too hastily updated the notes and bibliography of her dissertation without considering the implications of new material for her previous claims (as in the schêma discussion).  While the language of her definitive discussions of major issues, as she reached them in order, is usually clear and exact, her forward and backward references to those same issues often seem to emerge from some earlier approach and terminology.  Full and accurate indices are provided with great care, but elsewhere the proofreading is inadequate.  All the Greek is transliterated without distinguishing epsilon from eta, or omicron from omega.  Why the rush to publish?

Ultimately, however, it is Ionescu's own initial standpoint, that the Meno just is transitional, that makes too broad a range of claims available without further argument, excusing her from engaging the philosophers she lists in her notes who do not share her assumptions.  Many of those notes are mere rolls of "scholars" (or "see" or "see also"), without indications of what they argue or why.  As if dialectic itself were unseemly, Ionescu is timid about confronting her contemporaries' arguments, which is especially disappointing in those cases where the notes show, as with Weiss, that Ionescu recognizes a novel approach and knows that it is a challenge.  She provides scholarship, but not much engaged philosophy, and Ionescu knows the difference:  she criticizes Meno for failing to put up an argument (15), for not bothering to examine the reasons for his opinions (19), and for failure to own up to his own ignorance (72).

Ionescu advocates a "holistic approach" to the Meno, combining "examination of dramatic details and logical analysis of arguments" (xiii), but the two desiderata are effectively segregated, and the logical analysis subdued (cf. 141-42, 147-50).  Her advocacy does not mention any history of division among approaches to Plato (so, e.g., Ronna Burger and Gail Fine, the two times that they appear, appear together).  Rare, however, is the philosopher who can wield both methods without summoning one just when difficulties are becoming unmanageable with the other.  Rarer still is the philosopher who has both acute literary insight and razor-sharp analytic skill.  I count two or three, and I am not one of them.  The two approaches are extraordinarily difficult for any one person to achieve effectively, especially in a single study, and we cannot all be experts at everything.  To say that Ionescu, on her first try, does not successfully combine the two approaches she admires, is not damning criticism.  Of Lexington Books, however, I shall be twice shy.

[1] Four books are consistently cited throughout the notes:  Richard Stanley Bluck, Plato's Meno, Cambridge University Press, 1961; Jacob Klein, A Commentary on Plato's Meno, University of North Carolina Press, 1965; Roslyn Weiss, Virtue in the Cave:  Moral Inquiry in Plato's Meno, Oxford University Press, 2001; and Dominic Scott, Plato's Meno, Cambridge University Press, 2006, which appeared after the dissertation was written.