Plato's Meno

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Dominic Scott, Plato's Meno, Cambridge University Press, 2006, 238pp., $90.00 (hbk), ISBN 0521640336.

Reviewed by Raphael Woolf, King's College London


Dominic Scott has produced a monograph on the Meno that in its fluency and succinctness does justice to its subject and, like its subject, makes for a reading experience that is both pleasurable and challenging. The work is part of the series Cambridge Studies in the Dialogues of Plato, which places special emphasis on reading individual Platonic dialogues as integrated wholes. Scott has written very much in this spirit, and I would like to focus here on two related aspects of the way he sees continuity within the dialogue. First, there is the character of Meno; and second, what Scott labels as "Socrates on trial" -- the claim that in a number of important instances Socratic positions are subject to challenge by Meno, such that Socrates is thereby compelled to offer an explicit philosophical defense for theses that may previously have had the status of undefended assumptions.

Scott takes a somewhat downbeat view of Meno's character, though he also suggests that Socrates manages to initiate some limited improvement by the dialogue's end. In the main sections of the dialogue where Scott detects Socrates being put on philosophical trial, Meno's own character is variously "undisciplined … obtuse … resentful … and obstructive" (142) -- quite a litany. This glum assessment feeds into the notion that the challenges issued by Meno to various Socratic assumptions are made "in spite of himself" (141, 142, 216). Through a combination of intellectual and moral shortcomings Meno does not see their full philosophical significance, though an alert reader might do so. Thus "the dialogue operates at two levels" (30): there is the explicit conversation between Socrates and Meno; and a tacit conversation -- over Meno's head, as it were -- between Plato and his readership.

Such an approach requires us to make a rather sharp distinction between Meno's character and that of (at least some of) Plato's readership. Otherwise, it makes no sense to speak of the dialogue operating at two levels. Scott says very little about what he thinks Plato would have taken the dialogue's readership to be. He contrasts Meno with "a more sophisticated audience" (30) and "Plato's most sophisticated readers" (216), so we should perhaps take it that the higher level of communication is aimed at an intellectual elite, and that Plato was optimistic enough to believe at the time of writing that he had, or would have, readers who fitted the bill.

I wonder, though, whether Meno's responses are really poor enough to motivate this contrast of levels. Let us look at the four cases that Scott identifies as involving Socrates being put on trial. In the first, concerning what Scott calls the "unitarian assumption" -- the thesis, in brief, that there is a unitary property possessed by all things called by the same term -- Scott's complaint seems to be that Meno does not challenge the assumption immediately and wholeheartedly but "relatively late and somewhat weakly" (30). This supposedly demonstrates his "obtuseness" (ibid.). Yet Meno is in live dialogue -- is it really obtuse of him not to dive in straightaway? The charge seems particularly harsh given that elsewhere Scott condemns Meno for being "peremptory" (12). That aside, why is it a fault that Meno does not issue his challenge in stronger terms? Scott speaks of his "hesitation" (30), but this may betoken thoughtfulness rather than stupidity. Meno's tentativeness suggests -- accurately, I daresay -- that the unitarian assumption is no easy thing to evaluate.

When we come to the second case, Meno's comparison of Socrates to the stingray that numbs its victims, Scott is kinder, noting that Plato has awarded Meno "an extremely articulate speech" (72). Scott finds some fault, however, in stating that the speech displays "resentment", on the basis of its warning to Socrates not to travel abroad (74). It seems to me more natural to see this as a sign not of resentment on Meno's part but a kind of amazed bewilderment that characterizes the stingray speech as a whole -- this is surely the force of his prediction that Socrates might be arrested "as a wizard" (80b6) should he leave Athens.

In the third case, the issuing of Meno's famous paradox of inquiry, Meno's vice is apparently to be "eristic" -- that is, in unfurling the paradox "his concern is less with epistemology than with finding a successful debating tactic" (88). What Socrates actually says is that the argument (logos) is eristic, not that Meno is: the argument is surely a contentious one. Scott himself takes it be only partially successful, and uses this as another stick with which to beat Meno for not "appreciating its real significance" (ibid.), which, given the enormous controversy that interpretation of the paradox (contentious indeed!) has generated, seems a bit unjust. In any event, the fact that Socrates makes "use of the term 'erisitc' to describe the dilemma" (80) does not, without begging the question of Meno's character, imply that Meno's own "motives for using the argument are bad" (ibid.). There are actually two unwarranted steps here: from the application of the term to the argument to its application to Meno, and from what Socrates (supposedly) thinks about Meno to what the reader is supposed to think about Meno. (Scott is prone to making this latter move; I discuss a further example three paragraphs below.)

Scott seems to me equally mistaken in taking an earlier passage, 75c-d, to show that "Socrates implicitly accuses Meno of being eristic" (80). What Socrates does in that passage (quoted by Scott on p.35) is say how he would act if, respectively, his questioner were an eristic type, and if the parties were friends and wanted to have a proper dialogue. He then places himself and Meno firmly in the latter category, and goes on to do exactly what he says he would in cases of that sort. In the light of this, it is slightly perverse to claim that "[b]y mentioning the possibility that the questioner is 'erisitc'" Socrates is imputing that failing to Meno (36). More in line with the text is to read Socrates' remark less as a rebuke than a caution to Meno and the reader alike not to be tempted down the point-scoring path.

The final example of Socrates on philosophical trial concerns the method of hypothesis. Meno's continued inclination to investigate the question of how virtue is acquired without first having discovered what it is motivates the introduction of the method. This inclination is attributable to Meno's "impatience" (140), though fortunately it dovetails with Plato's own "pressing need to get an answer to a question of practical importance -- how virtue is acquired" (ibid).

Scott is surely right to describe the question of virtue's acquisition as one of "urgency" for Plato (140), but it is unclear why one should not regard it as similarly urgent for Meno. Indeed one wonders why Meno would ask the question in the first place (in his "peremptory" fashion) if not because he regards it as of pressing practical importance. It seems mere prejudice to deem Meno incapable of having a serious and sincere concern in raising and then not retreating from the issue. True, Socrates describes Meno as undisciplined in the speech that leads into his introduction of the method of hypothesis (86d3-e4, quoted by Scott on pp.63-4 and 131). But here we are on tricky ground. Socrates is portrayed as making a concession to Meno that he would rather not make. Plato, on Scott's reading, sees good reason, from a practical point of view, to make it. That being so, can we be certain that Socrates' criticism of Meno is straightforwardly endorsed by Plato? Perhaps it is only someone with Socrates' one-track mind who would regard Meno's desire to continue addressing the practical question as a sign of ill discipline. One should at least entertain the possibility that Socrates' playing of the character card at this point is meant to say more about him than about Meno.

Thus in none of the four examples of challenges to Socratic assumptions that he identifies does Scott seem to me to make a convincing case for regarding Meno as displaying significant moral or intellectual deficiencies as an interlocutor. To this extent I am unable to share his view that the Meno is designed to operate at two levels, if this is read, as seems intended, as requiring us to posit a Meno of low motives and brainpower in contrast with an eager, intelligent readership.

None of this is tantamount to denying that the dialogue places certain Socratic assumptions, including those that Scott highlights, under critical scrutiny. So let us look more closely at this aspect of his interpretation. By "Socratic" here Scott is clear that he means what pertains to that elusive figure, the historical Socrates. In the four cases of Socrates on trial that Scott deals with, the assumptions attributed to the historical Socrates are, respectively, the unitarian assumption, the notion that the elenchus is beneficial, our duty to inquire, and the thesis that we should discover what virtue is before we examine whether it is teachable.

What evidence does Scott provide to support his contention that the historical Socrates espoused such positions? Almost exclusively, it turns out, that they are positions that the character Socrates espouses in certain of Plato's dialogues, namely those that are often treated as "early" and as representing the spirit of the historical figure. For his latter three examples of Socrates on trial this is the only type of evidence that Scott cites; in the former case he adduces in addition a single text of Aristotle, whose reference to the historical Socrates rather than Plato's character is not beyond doubt (Scott defends its bona fides on p.28 n.5).

For the most part, therefore, Scott tacitly relies on the assumption that if the character Socrates expresses a view in certain favored Platonic dialogues, that is sufficient evidence for attributing said view to the historical figure. His assumption may be plausible; but it is startling nonetheless that Scott offers, as far I can see, no grounds for it. The absence of explicit methodological justification for treating some, but only some, of Plato's dialogues as reliable sources for the views of the historical Socrates makes it hard to place much credence on the contention that the historical figure is a specific target of examination in the Meno.

I would argue, then, that of the three features that Scott sets out on pp.27-8 as comprising the elements of what he sees as the Meno's trial of Socrates -- namely, that positions of the historical Socrates are at issue, that they come under serious philosophical challenge from Meno, and that Meno is not good enough to appreciate the force of the challenge -- the first and last lack solid foundation. Even with the second feature we have rather a mixed bag. The unitarian assumption surely does not come under serious philosophical challenge. Rather, as we saw above (and as Scott is keen enough to emphasize), Meno expresses hesitancy about endorsing its application to virtue. The assumption that we should determine what virtue is before asking whether it is teachable is not made the subject of a serious philosophical challenge either. Rightly or wrongly, Meno just wants to get on with investigating how virtue is acquired. In the case of elenchus as beneficial procedure, it is likewise a stretch to classify Meno's stingray speech as a serious philosophical challenge, wonderfully vivid though it is in pronouncing that the effects of elenchus can feel far from positive. Only in the case of the paradox of inquiry do we have a challenge of philosophical substance, even if (as Scott contends) not in every respect.

With the exception of the paradox, Meno is not in the business of issuing serious philosophical challenges, though he would need to be for the nicely dramatic idea that Socrates is standing trial to carry real weight. Nor, on the other hand, is Meno particularly stupid or badly behaved, though he would need to be for Scott to succeed in portraying him as failing to grasp the import of his own contributions. The root of the problem is, again, Scott's strategy of attempting to read the dialogue as operating on two levels. We require a Meno with enough about him to suggest material that sophisticates can engage with, but not enough to suggest that he belongs with them. I see no cause to erect such a narrow tightrope. Abandon it and we are free to observe Meno, without strain, as an imperfect but relatively decent interlocutor capable of reacting in a variety of different ways to various aspects of his encounter with Socrates. Not a very exciting conclusion, perhaps, but truer, I think, than the version Scott has on offer.

These remarks have been mostly critical. There is much richness and insight in Scott's interpretation of the Meno that I have not commented on. But its susceptibility to criticism is a virtue too. On both the strategic and the more detailed level, Scott presents his readings of the dialogue, and (in the main) his reasons for adopting them, with a lucidity and focus that makes it easy to raise questions. He has thereby given us a fine example of what writing about the Meno should look like, one that will have appeal to a wide readership, sophisticated and otherwise.