Plato's Myths

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Catalin Partenie (ed.), Plato's Myths, Cambridge UP, 2009, 255pp, $99.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780521887908.

Reviewed by Naly Thaler, Ben-Gurion University



This volume contains ten papers, eight of which have not been previously published, dealing with Plato’s use of myth in the dialogues. Of these ten papers, eight contain interpretations of a single myth from a particular dialogue, one contains an attempt to extract a coherent doctrine from Plato’s several eschatological myths, and one, the last, discusses the portrayal of themes from Platonic myths in Renaissance art. The volume also contains a helpful introductory essay by the editor surveying and discussing different interpretative approaches to Platonic myth.

The introductory essay announces that the papers contained in the volume all treat myth and philosophy as tightly bound together. This however, should not be taken to indicate that the various contributors share a common view as to the nature of this connection. The papers contained in the volume display a wide variety of approaches to their chosen myths. Some of the readings are fairly literal whereas others thoroughly symbolic; some authors read their chosen myth as a support for the dialogue’s main argument, whereas others see it as intended to cast doubt on the viability of its conclusion. This fact will be viewed as a shortcoming of the volume only by readers who approach it with the intention of discovering a unified account of what Platonic myth is. Those, on the other hand, who read it in the hope of acquiring a new perspective on the arguments of particular dialogues will be richly rewarded, as the majority of the papers are highly successful in using the myths to shed new and sometimes surprising light on these arguments.

In “Plato’s eschatological myths”, Michael Inwood examines Plato’s tales of the soul’s fate after its death, in particular those of the Gorgias and Republic, in an attempt to flesh out some of their metaphysical and ethical presuppositions and implications. The paper does not consist of a sustained single argument but is rather composed of a collection of inquiries and observations concerning its proposed topic. On its more metaphysical side, the paper tackles issues such as the relation between the unity of the reincarnated soul and the variety of personas it successively assumes, the soul’s retention of memories from previous lives, the particular type of indestructibility of soul that underlies the theory of metempsychosis, and even whether that theory was introduced in order to answer questions in the sphere of biology. The ethical side of the paper is concerned with discovering what notions of justice and fairness underlie the mechanisms of reward, punishment, and reincarnation introduced in the myths. In particular, it seeks to deal with the apparent incongruity of the fact that souls are rewarded and punished for their previous incarnated lives with the fact that part of that punishment and reward consists in the determination of their next incarnation, which seems to limit their accountability for actions performed while they are incarnated.

In "Myth, punishment and politics in the Gorgias", David Sedley proposes to read the myth about the workings of the necromantic penal system under Zeus as a symbol or allusion to the fact that Socratic refutation can function as a particularly efficient form of punishment. Accordingly, the superiority of the justice administered under Zeus to that which prevailed under Cronos, Sedley claims, should be read as a symbol of the superiority of the Socratic corrective procedure to contemporary Athenian judicial practices. Sedley argues that Plato takes the infliction of pain to be a useful corrective measure due to its ability to produce long term moderation of the appetites by temporarily depriving them of their objects. Socratic refutation (when performed in ethical contexts) achieves something akin to this by demonstrating to an interlocutor such as Callicles that his avowed practice of giving the appetites free rein is not in fact conducive to the happiness he pursues. Even by itself, that demonstration should already prove painful to Callicles. But it should also launch him down a path of a necessarily painful voluntary deprivation of the appetites in order to facilitate his self-improvement. This mechanism of corrective punishment is superior to the more familiar institutionalized version, Sedley argues, in containing an integral aspect of intellectual guidance. Whereas civic punishment is merely a form of habituation by pain, Socratic punishment cannot take effect without at least some level of recognition by the offender of the nature of and reasons for his error. Sedley concludes by asking the reader to reflect on whether Socrates sees himself as offering ways of improving civic penal institutions or whether his methods and claims (for example, about the need for an improved breed of rhetoric) are a critique of the effectiveness of any possible form of institutionalized punishment.

Gabor Betegh’s paper, "Tale, theology and teleology in the Phaedo", examines Socrates’ musings, when released from his fetters, on the manner in which Aesop would go about explaining the intimate relation between pleasure and pain. Betegh shows that the structure of the tale suggested by Socrates conforms, or seeks to conform, to a pattern that is common to the majority of Platonic myths, and that also contains the germ of what Plato takes to be a proper scientific explanation. The basic narrative form that is common to both Platonic myth and the ideal of Platonic science, Betegh claims, is based on four basic principles. First there is a description of a preliminary, deficient, state of affairs that predates the explanandum. Second, a divine benevolent agent possessing a desire and ability to remedy the situation is introduced. Third, we are presented with the divine agent’s analysis of the situation and with his working out a practicable solution in light of ineliminable constraints which it offers. Fourth, there is a detailed description of the functional features of his solution that corresponds to the current state of affairs (the explanandum). Betegh shows that this pattern conforms to Socrates’ theological commitments as they are described in the Euthyphro and in Xenophon’s Memorabilia 1.4, and that it is also in line with the strictures we find in Republic II on the sort of myths that citizens should be allowed to hear. On the scientific front, Betegh takes the four principles to define the difference between the sort of physical explanations Socrates criticizes in the Phaedo and the scientific explanation he hoped to find in Anaxagoras’ introduction of mind. Betegh concludes by showing how the creation story in the Timaeus fulfills Socrates’ expectations by conforming to the four principles of the explanatory model.

In "Fraternité, inégalité, la parole de dieu: Plato’s authoritarian myth of political legitimation", Malcolm Schofield explores Plato’s reasons for including the noble lie in the education of the citizens of the beautiful polity. The paper discusses the separate function of the two traditional themes combined in the myth, namely the Phoenician or Cadmian motif that the citizens are originally earthborn, and the Hesiodic motif regarding the distinct metallic constitution of their souls. Schofield takes the Cadmian aspect of the myth to function as a necessary means for instilling in the hearts of the citizens patriotic love and devotion to the state. This kind of love, he claims, is at odds with the basic, rational self-interest that motivates the citizens to participate in the state, and must therefore be inculcated by non-rational means. The Hesiodic motif in the myth plays a double role according to Schofield’s account. As part of the noble lie it is meant to justify the basic inequalities on which the state is structured and help preserve them by stipulating the destructive consequence of any deviation from them. But the reappearance of the Hesiodic motif in book VIII, as part of the explanation for why the best state will ultimately fall into a process of degeneration, Schofield claims, is intended mainly for the readers of the Republic, not for the citizens of the state it describes. It is a useful ancillary to the reasoned account for the collapse of proper civic order, since it picks up the inevitable element of contingency in such breakdowns which falls outside the scope of scientific explanations. Schofield concludes by arguing that, according to Plato, knowledge of reality, including familiarity with the Good, cannot function as an alternative to the noble lie as a means for securing the necessary degree of devotion to the well being of the state.

G. R. F. Ferrari’s paper, “Glaukon’s reward, philosophy’s debt: the myth of Er”, argues that the Republic‘s concluding myth should be read as a disparagement of the conception of justice as psychic health introduced in book IV. Ferrari contrasts Glaukon’s ‘heroic’ predilection for that conception of justice, manifested in his view that it is a beautiful achievement that is justly rewarded, with the perspective of the philosopher for whom psychic health is neither beautiful nor desirable, but merely a necessary distraction from his purely intellectual calling. From Glaukon’s perspective, justice as psychic health, being desirable for its own sake, fulfills the ideal he himself had sketched out in book II, and so is worthy of being rewarded as the highest human achievement. But for the philosopher the justice manifested in subduing his baser inclinations, as well as the justice that calls him to perform his civic duty and govern the state, are merely unwanted obligations which he has incurred due to his incarnated state. The myth, Ferrari argues, helps the reader achieve the philosopher’s perspective by presenting a highly ambiguous conception of justice’s rewards in the afterlife. Unlike the Phaedo‘s eschatological myth, which both picks out philosophers for special rewards that befit their intellectual predilections and exempts them from the perpetual cycles of reincarnation in which other mortals must participate, the myth of Er allots to philosophers the same rewards as other just individuals and, as in the case of the ordinarily just, does not exempt them from the cycle of reincarnations that puts them in risk of eventually descending into the sort of life for which they will incur future punishment. Thus, on Ferrari’s account, the myth accentuates the schism between the conception of justice that culminates in book IV (and reappears in books VIII and IX) and the intellectualist leanings of books V-VII.

“The charioteer and his horses: an example of Platonic myth making” constitutes a further stage in Christopher Rowe’s continuing explorations of the Phaedrus. Here he argues that Socrates’ mythological palinode should be understood as part of a wider strategy that dictates the composition of the Phaedrus, and that is indicative of Plato’s general approach to the writing of philosophy. This strategy consists in using the familiar sense of ordinary concepts as starting points in a discussion which gradually transforms them and imbues them with a more specialized philosophical content. The end result is a new appreciation for the real meaning or ideal denotation of these terms. This strategy, Rowe claims, is explicated by Socrates himself when he describes the ‘variegated logos’ that a properly informed speechwriter will produce. In the Phaedrus ‘the lover’ appears as a familiar concept, a fact that dictates Socrates’ treatment of it in the first of his two speeches. Then, in the palinode, Socrates uses the mythical figure of the charioteer in order to transform this concept by drawing parallels between it and another concept, namely, that of ‘the philosopher’, and showing that the experience of the philosopher, who is attracted to beauty itself, is in fact the more pure, and hence the more real of the pair. The result, Rowe claims, is a transformation of the reader’s conception of what eros is. After being lured into the discussion by the first speech, and having accepted that the subject under discussion is the experience of erotic love, the reader is now made to realize that this notion has a content of which he was previously unaware but which he now finds no way of denying. According to Rowe, the dialogue’s identification of the philosopher with the lover is a reflection of Plato’s own view of philosophy as a true erotic activity.

In "The myth of the Statesman" Charles Kahn seeks an explanation for why Plato intentionally veers the search for the statesman off course by having the discussants confound him with the divine shepherd, a mistake which is then exposed by the introduction of the myth about the age of Cronus. Kahn answers this question by focusing on the visitor’s later distinction between the three law-abiding constitutions and the rule of the statesman. The rule of law, although superior to unlawful constitutions, is said to be inferior to the rule of the ideal statesman; the latter possesses the requisite knowledge (of normative Forms, according to Kahn) for ruling, whereas written law is merely an imitation of such knowledge. Kahn claims that in making the distinction between the rule of law and the rule of knowledge, the visitor seems to be distinguishing between the best constitution available for our world and a divine ideal which that world cannot realize. This, Kahn claims, is the point where the myth should resonate and help set up a parallel between Cronus and the ideal statesman. Although the change in paradigm that ensues after the myth’s lessons are absorbed is liable to give the impression that the new definition of the statesman specifies an ideal that is appropriate for this world, the later description of the rule of law as something divine allows us to see that the definition has not in fact left “the mythical space of an alternative cosmic cycle” (160). In this, Kahn claims, the myth serves to bridge an apparent gap between the Statesman and the later, more legalistically oriented Laws. Both dialogues recognize the ideal of knowledge-based rule, but are nonetheless committed to the de facto superiority of the rule of law over all other alternatives.

In “Eikôs muthos” M. F. Burnyeat takes a new look at each of the two terms Timaeus uses to characterize his account of the formation of the cosmos, and at the sense of their combination in a single phrase. The bulk of the discussion is about the appropriate way to understand eikôs, for which Burnyeat identifies several complementing levels of meaning. First and most importantly, Burnyeat claims that in the present context eikôs should not be understood as an epistemologically derogatory term (as ‘probable’ would be) that an account would earn due to its failure to live up to a desired level of certainty. Rather, it signifies an ideal to which Timaeus’ account is intended to conform, namely, being ‘appropriate’ or ‘fitting’ to the subject matter at hand. It is the precise identification of the subject matter which provides the second level of meaning for eikôs. Burnyeat shows that Timaeus’ account sets out to describe, not merely an image of an eternal model, but also the process of practical reasoning that led to its formation. The use of the term eikôs, Burnyeat claims, is testimony of Plato’s awareness of the fact that practical reasoning has its own standards of rigor, and is not merely a failed attempt to replicate that which is appropriate to a deductive process. Rather than culminating in the discovery of some truth, that reasoning constitutes an attempt to offer the most ‘fitting’ solution to problems with which one is faced when attempting to instantiate a desired state of affairs. According to Burnyeat, by providing an account that is eikôs, Timaeus is observing natural phenomena and retracing the thought process of the benevolent artificer responsible for them. The fact that we are assured of this benevolence ultimately brings us back to the common translation of eikôs as ‘probable’. We can be assured of the high probability of the best practical explanation Timaeus comes up with since the demiurge’s stipulated benevolence guarantees he had in fact instantiated the best possible solution. As for the term muthos, Burnyeat claims that since Timaeus describes the created cosmos as a god, the story of its birth is a proper theogony and is hence the province of myth. Timaeus’ account then, Burnyeat claims, is intended to be taken as a ‘probable myth’, a nomenclature that serves to distinguish its orientation from that of the familiar peri phuseôs tradition.

In "Myth and eschatology in the Laws", Richard Stalley tackles the question of what significance should be attached to the fact that the myth of book X presents a mechanism of penology that appears substantially more impersonal than the ones in Plato’s earlier eschatological myths. Stalley challenges the view that the paucity of references to divine agents in the myth’s description of the rewards of justice and injustice reflects a shift in Plato’s view of the afterlife, from a legalistic and personal system of the administration of justice to a more mechanistic one which is based on the notions of cause and effect. Much of the paper is devoted to arguing that the Laws is compatible with the details of earlier myths and that there is no warrant for the claim that by the time he wrote it Plato came to be dissatisfied with several aspects of his earlier penology. Stalley claims that the reason for the change of emphasis in the myth’s description of the destinies of the virtuous and the wicked lies rather in the context in which it is introduced. The Laws’ eschatological myth is meant to complete the proof that the gods are mindful of every detail of the cosmos, including human affairs. In order to avoid the impression that this divine care excludes properly rewarding the virtuous and chastising the vicious, the legislator extends the scope of their fortunes beyond their present incarnation. This, Stalley claims, calls for the use of myth. But since the target of the tale is a religiously skeptical young man, the legislator must play down as many of the traditional aspects of mythical narrative such as divine personal agency, and leave only the skeleton of cosmic equilibrium.

The last paper in the volume, Elizabeth McGrath’s “Platonic myth in Renaissance iconography”, describes Renaissance artists’ efforts to translate motifs from Plato’s mythical narratives into pictorial form. These motifs, we learn, were available to the artists through filters such as Ficino’s occasionally misleading translations, the vogue for NeoPlatonism, and contemporary Christian predilections. The combination of these factors led to predominantly symbolic depictions of carefully chosen elements in the myths, which were often used to evoke notions alien to Plato’s thinking. McGrath provides a fascinating description of various attempts to cram the meaning of the Phaedrus’ complex narrative about the soul chariot into a single image, artists’ choices as to the precise form and gait of Aristophanes’ eight-limbed androgyne, different emphases in painters’ representation of the Republic’s cave, and even a theatrical orchestration of the myth of Er.