Plato's Natural Philosophy: A Study of the Timaeus-Critias

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Thomas Kjeller Johansen, Plato's Natural Philosophy: A Study of the Timaeus-Critias, Cambridge University Press, 2004, 218pp, $75.00 (hbk), ISBN 0521790670

Reviewed by Andrea Falcon, Virginia Tech


Plato and Aristotle share with us the assumption that the aim of natural science is to provide an objective description of the natural world. But the natural world as it is conceived by Plato and Aristotle is not a value-free world. They both are committed to the view that there are values in the natural world, or that values are part of the furniture of the natural world. Their job as students of nature is to attain understanding of the perfection and goodness of the natural world on the crucial assumption that we can objectively make value judgments about the natural world. This book is about Plato and his attempt to offer a representation of the perfection and goodness of the natural world in the Timaeus-Critias. But it is clearly in some sense intended as an introduction to a certain style of natural philosophy, which culminates in Aristotle's natural science. Plato and Aristotle consider teleology to be indispensable in studying natural processes. They both criticize their predecessors for failing to see this important truth about the natural world. This book is presented to the reader as a way to become familiar with the teleological outlook shared by both philosophers: "the teleological outlook that drives both philosophers often makes them confront the same kinds of questions and objections. I hope therefore to convey a sense of the ways in which Plato anticipates the concerns of Aristotle's natural philosophy, even where their specific answers differ" (5-6). The upshot of the book is that the Timaeus-Critias is much closer to Aristotle's natural philosophy than it is often thought.

One idea that surfaces several times in the book is that Plato's study of the natural world is ultimately motivated by an ethical concern. On this reading of Plato's natural philosophy, a study of the natural world provides objective grounds for the view that nature by its teleological order promotes the rule of reason over necessity. This is ethically significant since we face as human beings the same challenge to reassert the role of reason over necessity. "It is a tenet of Plato's thought that man is not alone in the universe with his moral concerns. Goodness is represented in the universe. We can therefore learn something about goodness by studying the cosmos. Cosmology teaches us how to lead our lives. It is therefore a recommended course of studies if we are to become better people" (1). The view that natural philosophy contains an ethical lesson is not unique to Plato, but it is not clear that Aristotle endorsed it. Indeed, it is possible to develop an interpretation of Aristotle according to which natural philosophy and ethics represent two distinct, autonomous spheres of philosophy. Like Plato, Aristotle believes that order, perfection, and goodness are found or discovered, not projected, in the natural world. But the relevance of these discoveries or findings for human agency is open to discussion. Admittedly, the author never claims that Aristotle agrees with Plato on the ethical relevance of natural philosophy. Nor does he say that Aristotle disagrees. His lack of explicitness on this point, however, is not entirely fortunate since the book is intended "to place the Timaeus-Critias within the context of Aristotle's philosophy" (5).

An area where the book makes a convincing contribution is in discussing the precise relationship between teleology and craftsmanship. Plato notoriously credits a divine craftsman for the creation of the universe. There is a sense in which the job of the divine craftsman is not different from that of any other craftsman. He has to act on a material, and the material is to be receptive of the model in order to be made like the model. The idea that the world is a product of design has enormous consequences for the history of natural philosophy. But the point I am interested in here is not this, but rather the following: how exactly is the appeal to a divine craftsman to be understood? From Aristotle we learn that a craftsman is the practitioner of a certain craftsmanship. Several times Aristotle insists that the craftsmanship, not the craftsman, is what matters. Strictly speaking, it is not the builder who is the moving or efficient cause of the house, but the art of building which resides in the builder. The author argues that this idea of craftsmanship is not restricted to Aristotle. It occurs repeatedly in Plato. In thinking about the divine craftsman we have therefore to disabuse ourselves of the pre-reflective notion that the craftsmen are individuals operating from particular beliefs, desires and intentions. Their beliefs, desires and intentions are to be understood in terms of the general attributes of the relevant craftsmanship. The divine craftsman is no exception to the rule. The divine craftsman is the manifestation of the relevant craftsmanship rather than an individual person with particular beliefs, desires and intentions. The salient point is this: "whilst this reading does not make the craftsman redundant, it does make questions about the individual craftsman's motivations extraneous to cosmology" (85).

The recourse to craftsmanship is motivated by the idea that craftsmanship is concerned with the production of order, perfection and goodness. But the divine craftsman works on the relevant materials by changing and organizing them according to his plan. This explains why craftsmanship is not the only cause of the world. Another is "necessity". Establishing what exactly Plato means by necessity and in what way it serves the divine craftsman as material is not an easy task. The task is not easy because "necessity" is part of a network of concepts which includes "wandering cause", "contributing cause" and "the receptacle". By considering necessity in relation to each of these concepts, the author shows how necessity enters into the explanation of the natural world. Once more, the model of craftsmanship can help us to understand how this network of concepts is to be understood. There is more to craftsmanship than working with ready-made materials. Craftsmen often have to prepare their materials. For example, a builder has to make his bricks before he can build a house. For one thing, he has to bake the bricks and make sure that they are hard, durable and impervious to moisture. This is true also of the divine craftsman. He has first to prepare the relevant materials, which in this case are the so-called simple bodies (earth, water, air and fire). The author argues that necessity is tied to the natures of these four bodies. On this reading, the receptacle does not provide the explanation of necessity, but it is rather preliminary to the explanation of necessity. Necessity arises out of the receptacle in the way the hardness, durability and imperviousness to moisture of the bricks arise from their being made of clay. The author argues that the contributing cause is the description of necessity in so far as it works for the good, and the wandering cause is the description of necessity in so far as it does not work for the good. The similarities between Plato's and Aristotle's teleology are not difficult to detect. Both philosophers recognize the existence of necessity besides teleology. Furthermore, they both insist on the priority of teleology over necessity by offering a description of necessity that shows its dependency upon an end.

In the final chapter of the book the author argues that teleology is also a principle of literary composition, that is, a principle that directs Plato in the composition of the account of the world. The account of the world offered by Timaeus is intended to mirror the beauty, proportionality and perfection of its subject matter: "Timaeus shows his concern with keeping his account proportionate with the relative importance and value of his subject matter. A proportionate account of the cosmos itself instantiates the order and relative importance of the parts of the cosmos" (192). This seems to be a very promising idea, but it alone cannot provide a full explanation for the scope and boundaries of Plato's teleology. It is important to remember that Timaeus is offering an account of "the all" down to the generation of "man" (see, for instance, 90 e 1-3). This self-imposed restriction explains why Timaeus can be confident that his account of the natural world is complete and lacks nothing once a discussion of the human body (pathology and anatomy included) is in place (see 92 c 4-9). If there is no doubt that Timaeus offers a general, unified account of the natural world in terms of which all the natural phenomena can be, at least in principle, explained, there is equally no doubt that this account is remarkably shy about plants and animals. I insist on this point because the upshot of the book is that Plato's natural philosophy is much closer to Aristotle's than one would initially expect. Although the author is successful in showing how Plato's concern for teleology anticipates Aristotle's, Plato's application of teleology is ultimately very limited. Consider the study of life. This study was not terra incognita before Aristotle. It would be a mistake to downplay the effort that Aristotle makes to place his investigation in the context of the Pre-Platonic investigation of nature. At the same time, however, Aristotle was undoubtedly the first to advocate the study of life in all its aspects and for its own sake. His interest on the topic of life is not limited to what is peculiarly human, nor does he even especially concentrate upon it. Aristotle famously insists that we should approach the study of each animal without aversion because "in all of them there is something natural and beautiful" (PA 645 a 22-23). There is no doubt that the unrestricted investigation of nature and the fact that teleology is found at work throughout the natural world in all its aspects is relevant to the fact Aristotle offers a detailed analysis of teleology in Physics II. This analysis is intended to provide not only the conceptual resources but also the conceptual unity for the subsequent specific investigations of the natural world. Put differently and more boldly, there is more than a difference in writing styles between Aristotle and Plato. The scope of his investigation forces Aristotle to arrive at a level of conceptual analysis that is not yet present in Plato.

There is much more in this book than I have been able to convey here. For example, the author discusses the function of the Atlantis story and how this story relates to the cosmological account offered by Timaeus. He also elaborates on the status of the cosmological account as a "likely account" or a "likely myth".

The book as a whole is characterized by careful analysis and attention to detail. It contains new insights and goes beyond the results reached by previous interpreters in an area of Platonic studies which is rapidly growing. A map that situates the book within this recent trend of Platonic studies is offered in the introduction. By showing how far Plato's concern with teleology can provide unity to the disparate topics discussed in the Timaeus-Critias, the author arrives at a distinctive and individual perspective which will be found interesting and stimulating by scholars working on Plato's as well as Aristotle's natural philosophy.