Plato's Philosophers: The Coherence of the Dialogues

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Catherine H. Zuckert,  Plato's Philosophers: The Coherence of the Dialogues, University of Chicago Press, 2009, 888pp., $45.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780226993355.

Reviewed by Christopher Long, The Pennsylvania State University


In his 1963 essay entitled simply, "Plato," Leo Strauss articulates a hermeneutical approach to the writings of Plato that might be taken as an epigraph to Catherine Zuckert's impressive study, Plato's Philosophers: The Coherence of the Dialogues. Strauss writes:

One could say that Plato's dialogues as a whole are less the presentation of a teaching than a monument to the life of Socrates -- to the core of his life: they all show how Socrates engaged in his most important work, the awakening of his fellow men and the attempting to guide them toward the good life which he himself was living.[1]

If the dialogues are a monument to the life of Socrates, Catherine Zuckert's book is a monument to the dramatic eloquence of Platonic writing. The book is itself monumental: the printed edition extends to 888 pages, once the impressive bibliography and thorough index are included, and the writing of the text took, as Zuckert emphasizes at the start, over 12 years -- a relatively brief time considering that it treats the dialogues in their entirety. The width of the volume and the breadth of its scope suggest the ambitious reading of Plato the book itself articulates.[2]

This book is by no means the first study of the dramatic dimensions of Platonic writing, but it is the most comprehensive attempt to date to bring Plato's dramatic depiction of the life of Socrates as a whole together into a single, overarching narrative.[3] And if it falls, as it inevitably must, sometimes into summary readings that too quickly adumbrate complex texts, still, it succeeds in offering a compelling picture of the dialogues as a "monument to the life of Socrates."

Zuckert's picture stands in stark contrast to what might still be called the orthodox approach to the Platonic dialogues, which divides them into periods associated with Plato's intellectual development. Zuckert traces the source of this "developmental" approach to Schleiermacher, suggesting that it took hold in the seminal work of A.E. Taylor, George Grote, and W.K.C. Guthrie (2).[4] Yet, even if Strauss was the most proximate influence on her approach to Plato, Zuckert's own reading remains indebted to two dimensions of Schleiermacher's seminal 1804 general introduction to Plato's work. There Schleiermacher requires us at once to treat the dialogues as a systematic whole and to take their artistic form as philosophical dialogues seriously.[5] For Zuckert, the systematic nature of the dialogues is found not, as it is for the developmental approach, in a story about the intellectual life of Plato; rather, if the dialogues are systematic, it is because they are the narrated story of the life of Socrates articulated in the context in which that life unfolds. Thus, Zuckert not only affirms something of Schleiermacher's concern for the internal coherence of the dialogues, she also follows him in taking their artistic form seriously as a mode of philosophical expression.

The philosophy that finds expression in the dialogues is rooted in the philosophical life Socrates embodies. Zuckert depicts that life as punctuated by decisive encounters with three significant philosophers: Parmenides early in his life, Timeaus as he comes into his own, and the Eleatic Stranger just after his death sentence is pronounced. The whole picture is, however, framed by the presence of a fourth philosopher, the Athenian Stranger of the Laws, a figure who sets the stage for Socrates' encounters with the other three philosophers by articulating the central problem of the relationship between the ruling principle, associated with Anaxagorean nous, and the flux of disorderly motions, associated with the cosmic battle between good and bad (55-6).

By rendering the Laws pre-Socratic and treating it as the first in the narrative order of the dialogues, Zuckert stands in opposition to a long tradition of scholarship that reads the Laws as the last and thus most "Platonic" of the dialogues. That orthodoxy takes its cue from the story Diogenes Laertius tells of how the written text was found unfinished on wax tablets at the time of Plato's death.[6] What is last in the order of composition must, so the thinking goes, reflect Plato's philosophy at its most independent and mature.

The bold, unorthodox interpretation of the Laws Zuckert offers is indicative of her commitment to a hermeneutical approach that seeks the coherence of the dialogues in their internal narrative structure. One virtue of this approach is that stylometric analyses and apocryphal stories related to the vexing questions concerning the order in which the dialogues were composed become philosophically irrelevant. However, in order to establish the dramatic order of the dialogues, Zuckert is forced to appeal to references in each dialogue that connect its action to some historical time period. Thus, in her argument for the dramatic primacy of the Laws, she points to its frequent references to the Persian Wars and the absence of any reference to the Peloponnesian War. Further, she insists that we find teachings and philosophical positions in the Laws closely associated with pre-Socratic philosophy as opposed to views that would gain prominence in the generation of Socrates (53-8).[7] Of course, as these speculations concerning the dramatic date of the Laws suggest, Zuckert has traded one vexing question for another: determining the dramatic date of a dialogue is no less difficult or controversial than determining its order of composition.

Even so, Zuckert articulates a compelling narrative. One way to chart a path through this rich and exhaustive volume is to attend carefully, as Zuckert herself does, to the way Socrates appears in the dialogues over against the other philosophers Plato depicts. Zuckert's text is itself framed by the appearance of two tables, one outlining the dramatic chronology of the dialogues (8-9) and the other charting the differences between Plato's five philosophers (44-5).[8] If the former outlines the temporal order in which the dialogues, and thus Zuckert's own text, unfold, the later offers a kind of topographical map that brings the differences between the philosophers into sharp relief. What this map clarifies and what emerges vividly in the course of the book is that Socrates differs from Plato's other philosophers insofar as he understands erotic things whereas they do not.

The erotic nature of Socratic philosophy and politics runs like an Ariadne's thread through the course of Zuckert's text. The book begins by emphasizing that "Socrates presents philosophy as a fundamentally erotic activity" (15). Early on, the Athenian Stranger is shown to search for knowledge and question the justice of laws in sober dialogue with elder statesmen by comparing the institutions and practices of their respective regimes (61); whereas Socrates is erotically drawn to young people and attempts to cultivate in them a desire for justice and knowledge. The book goes on to suggest how an early encounter with Parmenides shows that philosopher to have little interest in human motives and desires as he attempts to articulate the nature of the whole (178-9); whereas Socrates recognizes that the whole itself involves the erotic interrelation of things different in kind. In the middle of the book, Timaeus offers a beautiful account of the cosmos as a whole, but fails to understand human erōs as anything more than a sign of our incompleteness (465); whereas "Socratic philosophy constitutes the culmination and purest expression of human erōs and philia" (587) because it awakens in us an awareness of our limits and a desire for what is just and beautiful and good. In the end, the Eleatic Stranger seeks to divide and sort things horizontally in terms of their similarities and differences; whereas Socrates considers each thing vertically in terms of its erotic relation to the good (681).

To trace the thread of erōs through the book in this way is not to reduce to one the variety of differences Zuckert identifies between Socrates and Plato's other philosophers. Rather, it is to amplify one of the most philosophically poignant points of the book: the idiosyncratic practices of Socratic philosophy and politics are rooted in his erotic relationships to others and to the ideals with which he is always concerned. Zuckert puts it this way toward the end of the book: "By contrasting Socrates with other philosophers, Plato also indicated why philosophy will always remain a search for wisdom rather than the possession of it" (861). If it was Parmenides who, early in Socrates' life, led him into aporia concerning the precise relationship between those permanent, purely intelligible ideals and the sensible things that participate in them, by the end, in the Phaedo, Socrates had learned enough about the erotic nature of our human relation to those ideals that he no longer felt a need to do anything more than posit their existence and assert that each thing is just or beautiful or good by participating somehow in those ideals (Phaedo, 100c-e).

The practice of Socratic philosophy and politics can thus be understood to involve cultivating in those of us who come to encounter it an erotic desire to orient our lives toward those ideals, an orientation that has the capacity to transform our relationships with one another and the world in which we live. Recognizing this, Zuckert writes:

Plato shows that Socrates' search for definitions of justice or virtue in itself led him to emphasize the way in which human desire and thought prompt us to look beyond our immediate circumstances to what is purely intelligible, for direction in living our lives. Plato's Socrates calls that more or less articulate 'looking,' erōs, and he states several times that ta erōtica are the only things he knows (587).

Even if one might take exception to some of the more idiosyncratic dimensions of the readings Zuckert offers of individual dialogues -- as for example, when she fails to recognize the degree of success Socrates has teaching Phaedrus how to read texts in the Phaedrus or the subtle differences between the characters of Glaucon and Adeimantus in the Republic -- nevertheless, the eloquent truth of this monumental book is discerned in the beautiful picture it offers of the erotic philosophical and political life Socrates is shown to live. If, as Strauss suggests, the dialogues show Socrates awakening those he encounters to the transformative power of ideals and turning them toward the good life, Zuckert's book awakens us to practices of Platonic writing that seek to do with each new reader what Socrates did with each person he encountered.

[1] Leo Strauss and Joseph Cropsey, History of Political Philosophy (Chicago: Rand McNally, 1963), 7. Zuckert was herself a student of Strauss's at the University of Chicago.

[2] Although references to the text are always to the physical book, the book was read for this review in its Kindle edition. This rendered the monumental text more portable and thus more easily accessible, even if it detracted from the ability to navigate effectively between different sections of its complex, but elegant, structure.

[3] Although Leo Strauss and his students have been eloquent voices in the attempt, over the past half century, to read the action of the dialogues together with their arguments, the dramatic approach, broadly understood to include all those who recognize the philosophical importance of the artistic form in which the dialogues were written, has now been widely adopted by various traditions, if to varying degrees. Over the past thirty years, a number of important collections have been published in the spirit of articulating a dramatic approach. To take one from each of the last three decades, see, for example: Charles L. Griswold, Platonic Writings, Platonic Readings(New York and London: Routledge, 1988); Francisco González, The Third Way: New Directions in Platonic Studies (Lanham, MD: Rowman & Littlefield, 1995); Gary Alan Scott, Philosophy in Dialogue: Plato's Many Devices (Northwestern University Press, 2007). More recently, one place in which this approach has found rich soil for development is the Ancient Philosophy Society, whose work over the past decade has been published in Epoché: A Journal for the History of Philosophy.

[4] More recently, Gregory Vlastos has been responsible for the ongoing dominance of this orthodoxy. See Gregory Vlastos, Socratic Studies, ed. Myles Burnyeat (Cambridge University Press, 1994), 135. For a good discussion of the limits of a chronological approach oriented by Plato's intellectual development, see Jacob Howland, "Re-Reading Plato: The Problem of Platonic Chronology," Phoenix 45, no. 3 (1991): 189-214. For an excellent overview of the state of Plato scholarship up into the mid-1990's, see Gerald A. Press, "The State of the Question in the Study of Plato," The Southern Journal of Philosophy 34, no. 4 (1996): 507-532.

[5] Plato and Friedrich Schleiermacher, Platons Werke (G. Reimer, 1855). For a discussion of these two dimensions of Schleiermacher's introduction, see Francisco J González, Dialectic and Dialogue (Northwestern University Press, 1998), 3-4.

[6] Diogenes Laertius, Diogenes Laertius: Lives of Eminent Philosophers, vol. I (Cambridge, Mass: Loeb Classical Library, 1925), III.37.

[7] Interestingly, this reading of the Laws places Zuckert in opposition to Strauss too, for he suggests that we might take the Athenian Stranger in the Laws as a Socrates imagined to have escaped from prison. See Leo Strauss, The Argument and the Action of Plato's Laws (University of Chicago Press, 1998), 1-2.

[8] One significant limit of the Kindle edition of the book is that the important table concerning the "Differences among Platonic Philosophers" is almost illegible.