Plato's Republic: A Critical Guide

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Mark L. McPherran (ed.), Plato's Republic: A Critical Guide, Cambridge University Press, 2010, 273pp., $85.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780521491907.

Reviewed by Nickolas Pappas, City University of New York


In the past few years, the Republic's readers have already been lucky enough to see two other fine anthologies dedicated to that dialogue.[1] This new Critical Guide is much shorter than those, but it stands well in their company and shares some contributors with them (including McPherran himself). This volume, a collection of papers that were mostly presented at a 2008 conference, is pitched to specialists slightly more than the other anthologies are; on the other hand, its selections are shorter, so even the difficult chapters feel more inviting than longer versions of them would have been. Freshness is at a premium, the contributors either seeking out neglected topics in philosophy's least-neglected work or else returning to familiar debates with innovative strategies for resolving them.

The first three chapters address the Republic as a whole. G. R. F. Ferrari analyzes the narrative movements in the Republic to spot where Socrates loses control over the conversation and Plato tightens his authorial grip, and to tell why this shift of control matters. Rachel Barney finds a pattern of ring-composition that frames the dialogue between themes and their resolutions, homing in on Book 10 to show how nuanced such "resolutions" can be. Julia Annas brings the Republic into closer conversation with the myth of Atlantis, told in the Timaeus and Critias, which is supposed to illustrate the Republic's political proposals.

The next five chapters take up the Republic's value theory. Rachana Kamtekar returns to an old question that has found new life: how far the Republic is meant as a work of political theory. She uses cases of just action by the good city's people to bridge the gap between ethics and politics in the argument. Nicholas Smith lays out the restrictions on explaining why philosophers will return to the cave until there seems to be no way of satisfying them all, then offers a new way out. Zena Hitz traces the city's decline into degenerate regimes, finding "shadow-virtues" lingering at every stage before the tyrannical city, as reason carries on its long death-struggle with appetite. Still within value theory is Mark McPherran, turning to look back at the Republic's moral theory from its farewell story and probing how far the myth of Er can absolve the gods of all blame for the lives that people lead. Finally, Christopher Shields digs into the foundational argument for dividing the soul and clears away what he sees as accretions that have obscured that core argument.

The topic shifts to theory of knowledge for the next three pieces. J. H. Lesher examines the saphêneia that is said to increase as one ascends the Divided Line; "clarity" is the common translation, but Lesher uses evidence from Plato and pre-Platonic texts to argue that the term less metaphorically identifies "full and exact awareness." Hugh Benson closely compares the Line's third and fourth stages and argues that Plato judges them by a single standard, which dialectic satisfies with its method of confirmation but which "dianoetic" leaves half-done. And in his overview that embraces all aspects of the Republic's educational proposals, C. D. C. Reeve shows how much is entailed -- breeding, gymnastics, and dialectic -- in producing those special few who not only both contemplate the Forms and rule the city, but do the latter by virtue of having done the former.

The topic of education links Reeve's contribution to the final essay. Malcolm Schofield notes how little the Republic's interpreters have said about instrumental music, and identifies hopeful functions that rhythm and mode can play in the guardians' educations.

Going through all these articles with a few words of assessment for each would make for a tedious, uninformative review. I will comment on several contributions with the hope that my remarks communicate a sense of the entire book's merits.

Start with Ferrari's analysis that opens the volume; this and Schofield's at the end must be its most original contributions. Ferrari probes the "internal narration" found in the Republic and only two other dialogues (Charmides, Lysis). Where the dialogue identifies no audience before whom one could imagine Socrates tailoring his story, he ceases to function as an unreliable narrator. He admits to losing control over the conversation; he freely improvises in sight of the reader, guessing what will convince his interlocutor.

More specifically, Ferrari says that changes in narrative method after Book 1 turn Socrates into a frank reporter of the Republic's conversation. Book 2 does not replace the "early" disputatious Socrates with a positive theorist of Forms. It is the same Socrates throughout, only no longer hiding from the reader after Book 1. Socrates lays his cards on the table when he speaks of Forms and the best constitution; he improvises, sincerely trying to figure out what the Good is like. Meanwhile, his creator Plato hides more than ever.

Ferrari believes that his analysis tells against three popular readings of Plato: developmentalist, Straussian, and Tübingen. He may indeed have discovered an alternative to demarcations between an early Socrates who dismantles claims to wisdom and the middle period's "mouthpiece" for Platonic metaphysics. But his approach is not likely to silence the other schools of thought, because the sine qua non of esotericist readings is authorial control, not the control that a character exercises. Transfer the power from Socrates to Plato if you like; there is still someone hiding, and an interpretive approach can still aim at disclosing what that someone has hidden. A Straussian reading can continue to call the Republic's good city "ironic" even if it has to adapt to Ferrari's analysis by making the irony Plato's instead of Socrates's. Socrates may be telling all he believes, but Plato behind the scenes holds a different doctrine.

To address esotericist readings, Ferrari might augment his approach by consulting the Protagoras, whose stub of a prefatory framing dialogue is all that disqualifies it from counting as an internally-narrated work. There too Socrates scrambles to stay on top of the conversation. But in the Protagoras Plato depicts Socrates using dialectic to extract philosophical truths from a poem by Simonides. He dismisses the poet's intention as extraneous to philosophy and Simonides ceases to haunt the conversation. Could Ferrari incorporate this passage into his analysis? He masterfully presents the Republic's taxonomy of narrative as a marker of the distance between Socrates and the author who governs him. Maybe the Protagoras can show what that same power-dynamic implies about searches for an author's intention. Socrates, out of control, wrests control away from an author: has Plato thereby hinted at his continuing domination of the dialogue, or at a way to end that domination?

Annas comes at Plato the author by another route, as she links the Republic to the Timaeus and Critias. She draws on Pierre Vidal-Naquet's powerful reading of the Atlantis story, together with Christopher Gill's vision of the Timaeus as a first work of fiction, and goes a long way toward harmonizing this vision of Athens with the Republic's proposals for a life of virtue.

For example: why should Plato say that both Atlantis and the original Athens were destroyed after their showdown? Not content with the simplistic answer that this tidies up the story, Annas recalls the Republic's judgment of a virtue that suffices for good life even when no one knows about it. Why did Plato leave the story unfinished? Annas appeals to the Republic again. The bewitching Atlantis story still entices readers today, she says. Maybe Plato recognized the mimetic danger in his story and interrupted it before it could do more harm.

This last sounds likely; I would only add that the Critias stops when Zeus resolves to ruin Atlantis, presumably by leading it into war. Zeus announces his will at an assembly of the gods. But the Iliad begins with a reference to the will of Zeus behind the Trojan War, and Zeus addresses the assembly of gods at the start of the Odyssey to set off that poem's plot. As one commentator writes, "the Critias breaks off exactly where a traditional epic poem should begin."[2] Plato stops writing when he seems about to embark on another epic. Supplanting Homer is one thing, recapitulating his errors is something else. The mimêsis would have gone obviously too far if more Homeric verse had followed.

Annas's suggestion about the worth of unseen virtue is less convincing. For if the Timaeus hides the greatness of old Athens inside a lost antiquity, it also dedicates itself to revealing that glory. The dialogue echoes Herodotus in numerous respects, including a nearly-direct quote about "great and wondrous deeds"; it is Herodotean generally in combating the loss of historic memory. Virtue might still be worthy when no one knows about it, but the Timaeus nevertheless wants to spread the news of at least one great example.

Staying entirely within the Republic, Smith takes up a central problem with the philosopher-kings. What makes philosophers virtuous rulers is the strength of their desire for knowledge, a desire that besides weakening anti-social appetites also leaves one reluctant to rule. Given their preference for contemplation, rational governance would seem to call for the philosophers' unhappy impressment into service. On the other hand, the demand that they rule the city is a just demand, and their justice of character ought to leave the philosophers happy when they act rightly. Why this talk of compelling them?

Smith proposes a solution from an unexpected quarter, putting the Republic's psychological theory to work. The thumoeides "spirited, angry" part of these kings-in-training prompts them to want the honor that comes with the responsibilities of rule even though their reason craves contemplation and knowledge. As they grow to be full philosophers they will adapt to the necessity to govern, until governing finally makes them happy.

It is tricky to apply the Republic's theory of soul to persons in the good city, which was meant as a whole to illustrate the human soul. But this move can't be avoided in elucidating a passage on citizens' motives. Smith brings welcome news for the good city's governance and for the dialogue's coherence if the philosopher-kings should want the honors attendant upon rule. But now perhaps the danger returns that the philosophers' reluctance to rule had been designed to avoid. When those in power desire that power, as they do in existing societies, justice becomes what Thrasymachus calls the interest of the stronger. The good city was supposed to answer Thrasymachus, but here are the new philosopher-kings with a strong reason to rule and hence an individual interest in holding office. The city's first decline into honor-loving threatens to begin in its moment of flourishing.

Smith leaves us contemplating the Republic's difficult conception of reason, which both looks out for the good of the whole soul and also craves its own special pleasure of knowledge. It has been widely observed that reason's specific desire threatens to conflict with its interest in what is best over all. Smith uses "tyranny" to describe a soul whose yearning for contemplation dominates its other desires; that word implies that the desire proper to reason can act against the harmonious ordering of the soul. But this means that the philosophers are not the safe candidates for power that the Republic had promised.

As it approaches its conclusion the Republic depicts the best soul and city degenerating through steadily worse forms to become tyrannies. Hitz looks, as scholars have largely not done, for a deep structure informing this decline. She argues that every stage features a battle between reason and the appetites; more remarkably she finds "shadow-virtues" in all cities but the worst. The best city's justice -- real justice -- consists in reason's commanding appetite. But reason weakens as the city worsens, and mere appearances of virtue emerge in the inferior regimes. As reason can achieve less, Hitz says, it contents itself with seeming temperance in oligarchy, seeming lawfulness in democracy.

Hitz is surely right to look for explanatory principles at work in Platonic historiography. But speaking of "appearances" undoes the explanation she offers. "Shadow-virtue" could mean a remnant of virtue, a shadow of its former self. The phrase is vague and amenable to more than one explication. Pinning it down as appearance makes the shadow a deception. We have returned to Glaucon's thought-experiment from Book 2, in which a lucky unjust man seems perfectly just. His utter viciousness includes his possessing the appearance of justice. So if the shadow-virtues that Hitz sees in the degenerating cities are virtue-appearances, then she has found not would-be or etiolated virtues but canny vices. This is already the worst human experience and not a way station heading to the bottom. Hitz will need to cash out shadow-virtues in different language.

Hitz and Smith both ground themselves in the Republic's theory of divisions in the soul. But some scholars challenge the very idea of a tripartite soul in the Republic. Shields advances a strong version of psychological minimalism, leaving the "parts" of the soul no longer essential to its nature; no longer homunculi each functioning as a little person within; no longer even components, Shields finally says. Call reason and the rest "aspectual parts." Your hunger is a part of you only in the respect in which the surface of the Louvre is a part of that museum. One can itemize the Louvre's parts without necessarily listing them "surface, interior surface," etc., and likewise one can speak coherently of you without having to identify you as reason, spirit, desire. Your hunger is a part of you only inasmuch as you are hungry.

Shields attends to the different versions of the soul that surface in the various sections of the Republic, but his argument principally rests on his analysis of Book 4, pressing hard on the argument for divisions in the soul. How much does that argument entail, and what does it not entail? It is always bracing to take such pains with a familiar work; Shields argues cogently and is not easy to refute. To some degree the popularly imagined "parts of the soul" have indeed become reified in an internalist psychology, and Plato's readers ought to approach particular passages inquiring how many interior players a given stretch of argument really calls for.

But more than textual analysis lies behind most challenges to the Republic's soul-parts. Much turns on what a reader considers an adequate explanation. The argument in Plato requires that when you feel both inclined to eat and resolved not to, some source for each impulse must exist in your soul. Opposed forces are at work, and the argument in Book 4 calls for an explanatory origin behind each force. What cause will do? Shields takes explanatory homunculi to beg the question, leaving the soul's mysteries unacknowledged. When we envision two little subjects within shouting "Eat!" and "Don't!" we have turned a profound human experience into a domestic drama of neighbors quarreling. The danger in Shields's eyes is a mythology that merely transports conflict to a fictionalized interiority without accounting for it.

But the opposite extreme poses explanatory dangers too. If aspectual parts re-describe psychological phenomena, they will fail at the basic task that Socrates assigns to his psychology. How can it be that I want to eat but also want not to? Shields's alternative seems to say "In one way I want to eat and in another way I don't." Compare asking why you can't see the Louvre's paintings from the street and being told "Because of its exterior." The explanation looks very much like the explanandum.

In fact, when you want to explain why food is salty, you sometimes blame the soy sauce, never the salty aspect of the food. Some of Shields's readers may feel relieved at no longer having to envision the lion of spirit bounding within the soul's cage; the aspectual part that replaces the lion might remind others of dormitive virtue.

These are five selections, less than half of this rich assortment. Only space, not lack of interest or appreciation, prevents me from engaging with every contribution at the same length, for a wide spectrum of issues has been updated in this excellent book. Every philosopher who has thought about the Republic will find something here that illuminates an aspect of the dialogue; specialists will want to spend time with many of the twelve selections.

[1] Gerasimos Santas (ed.), The Blackwell Guide to Plato's Republic (Malden, MA: Blackwell Publishing, 2006); G. R. F. Ferrari (ed.) The Cambridge Companion to Plato's Republic (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2007).

[2] Andrea Capra, "Plato's Hesiod and the Will of Zeus: Philosophical Rhapsody in the Timaeus and Critias," in G. R. Boys-Stones and J. H. Haubold (eds.) Plato and Hesiod (Oxford: Oxford University Press, 2010), p. 214.