Plato's Republic: A Dialogue in 16 Chapters

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Alain Badiou, Plato's Republic: A Dialogue in 16 Chapters, Susan Spitzer (tr.), Columbia University Press, 2012, xxxvi + 372pp., $35.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780231160162.

Reviewed by Sol Goldberg, University of Toronto


Plato's "cave allegory" is among the best-known passages in the entire history of philosophy, perhaps even in the entire history of literature. This brief narrative not only remains a fixture in introductions to the discipline for its account of the philosophical enterprise and its challenges, but has also become part of the fabric of popular culture where it serves as a convenient and dramatic image of the pursuit of truth and freedom. There are renderings on YouTube in addition to several big-screen adaptations like The Matrix and The Truman Show. Its current popularity and familiarity can make it quite difficult for us, however, even to consider, let alone to re-enact, how we, if among its first audience, might have received this early account of philosophy, which, bear in mind, was at that time itself hardly more than a fledgling venture with an uncertain future. It is fortunate for us, then, that Plato provides a report. At the beginning of Book 7 of the Republic, we find along with the details of the cave allegory the reaction of its initial addressee, Glaucon, who happens to be Plato's brother as well as Socrates' interlocutor. Asked to imagine an underground cave with shackled prisoners who spend their lives unaware that the shadows which endlessly captivate them actually lack reality, Glaucon replies that the image and the prisoners are atopon, "strange," though -- as Socrates counters -- their lives and surroundings very closely resemble our own existence. In short, an analogy now perfectly obvious to us originally was crafted to de-familiarize the most familiar reality of all.

This thought occurred to me repeatedly as I read Alain Badiou's book. The book is many things: funny, offensive, frustrating, thought-provoking, ridiculous, and tedious. But, more than anything else, it is strange. I don't just mean that I found the book strange, though that word captures as well as any my overall experience in reading it. I mean primarily that its general intent seems to be estranging in the sense that Viktor Shklovsky uses this term to describe poetry in "Art as Technique." And, as ironic as it might sound, perhaps only in its effect of estrangement, its de-familiarization of the familiar, does Badiou's "hypertranslation"[1] of Plato's Republic resemble at all the original that we have come to know so well.

Now, whatever else hypertranslation is, it clearly results in something quite dissimilar from anything produced by the many previous translators of the Republic, from Benjamin Jowett, R. E. Allen, Paul Shorey, and Francis Cornford to Allan Bloom, Desmond Lee, Tom Griffith and C. D. C. Reeve. Badiou's hypertranslation -- which, inter alia, alludes to iPods and Lance Armstrong, turns the cave allegory into a movie-theatre allegory, replaces "the soul" with "the Subject" and "god" with "the Big Other", and changes Adeimantus, a male character in the original, to Amantha, a female character[2] -- differs so greatly from all the various earlier translations in method as well as in substance that a comparison would be pointless. But, at the same time, hypertranslation remains a kind of translation, a procedure for conveying the sense of something from one context to another. Hence, however peculiar or particular its method and practice might be, it nevertheless still reveals a certain judgment about that which is being hypertranslated and about how it is best hypertranslated into its new framework, a judgment, that is, about the source text in its native context and about the target context in which the new text hopes to find a home.

What exactly is a hypertranslation of Plato's Republic, then? And why devote six years -- as Badiou claims to have done -- to such a project? To answer these questions, I'll first review Badiou's account of his method and then examine some of the peculiar results of its application with the intent of highlighting what struck me as the pervasively strange feature of the book, namely, the rejection or abandonment of anything like Plato's hope for a world governed by an ideal of reason and his belief that rational dialogue provides the only chance for approximating that ideal. Although mostly concerned here with how Badiou's hypertranslation is strange and estranging in its effort to undermine this classically Platonic project by means of Plato's classical text, I'll also add some final words about how one might nevertheless consider this strangeness productive.

Badiou describes his method of "treating the text" twice, once in greater depth in the "Preface" written for the original French volume (and reproduced in the English edition, which is what I read), and also briefly in the "Author's Preface to the English Edition." The latter mostly congratulates Badiou's translator, Susan Spitzer, whom he regards as a co-author of the English version. In this context we are also told, however, that his "French rendering aims to completely recontextualize the Greek text in such a way that its origins will be practically forgotten in the headlong rush of the most natural-sounding French possible" (xxix-xxx, my italics). Whereas here Badiou supposedly intends a translation that gains complete independence from Plato's Republic, his description of his method in the French "Preface" suggests a slightly different objective. Badiou explains there that his method is "never a forgetting of the original text, not even of its details" even if it is also "almost never a 'translation' in the usual sense of the term"; that "Plato was ever-present, although perhaps not a single one of his sentences was restored exactly as he wrote it"; and that while each revision "would depart one step further from the letter of the original text . . . such departures are a matter of greater philosophical fidelity to the text" (xxxii-xxxiii, my italics).

The difference in the two statements is noteworthy, for it reveals not so much a tension in his method per se as a degree of ambivalence in Badiou's attitude towards Plato. Badiou, in other words, could have rewritten -- rather than hypertranslated -- the Republic in the various ways and for the various purposes that, say, the Aeneid rewrites the Odyssey and the Iliad, or Being and Time rewrites the Critique of Pure Reason, or Clueless rewrites Emma. But Badiou has chosen not to do so. Instead, while wanting not to be shackled in any way by Plato's original, he nevertheless wants his version to be more than merely indirectly associated with it. The strong tie to the original is suggested already in the title of the book, which Badiou decided to call Plato's Republic rather than either The Republic, a more ambiguous alternative, or Badiou's Republic, a more accurate alternative.

This practically-minimal but somehow all-important general fidelity to Plato's Republic fits with Badiou's claim about Plato's relevance today in the "Preface" (as well as elsewhere, e.g., his 2007-08 seminar at the École Normale Supérieure in Paris titled "Plato: For Today"). Plato, we are told, "is the one we need first and foremost today, for one reason in particular: he launched the idea that conducting our lives in the world assumes that some access to the absolute is available to us . . . in the construction of eternal truths" (xxxi). This view about the necessity and availability of the absolute meets what we would expect of anyone drawn to Plato today to find appealing in his thought. Plato remains the classic source for every opposition to skepticism, naturalism, and relativism, various sorts of which are prevalent in contemporary philosophy. Badiou, too, surely has similar intentions in mind when he writes his Communist Idea into Plato's Republic. Plato remains a vital source for regarding the arrangements that order our actual social and political lives against some atemporal ideal of justice, even as Badiou insists against Plato that the ideal of justice must be the property and responsibility of every worker-citizen, each of whom must therefore also be a philosopher-leader (pp. 166-7).

But, notwithstanding Badiou's bold and seemingly sincere statement about Plato's contemporary relevance, his hypertranslation of the Republic rejects the original in transforming specific doctrines and its general tenor. Moreover -- or, perhaps, more strangely -- Badiou at more than one point actually dissociates himself from Plato with the help of Socrates, whose thought, we are told, Plato has misunderstood and misrepresented. The most explicit instance is in a discussion of whether the family would be dissolved in the communism that Badiou requires as the idea of a just state. Here Badiou enlists against Plato's Socrates his own Socrates, who exclaims: "Taking advantage of the opportunity given me here by Badiou, I solemnly protest your brother Plato's interpretation of my thinking" (160). How one reads this statement depends in part on whether one entertains the possibility that Badiou is being ironic about the limits of his own communism, a possibility that might further depend on whether one thinks that he considers ironic the original suggestion in theRepublic to dissolve the family. But the rhetoric here nonetheless makes plain that Badiou's revision of Plato involves to some degree a rejection of Plato. So -- contrary to what might be suggested in the above quotes about the method of translation -- even if Badiou's modernization of Plato does not intend to bury him, neither does it come simply to praise him.

Badiou's most striking and strange transformation of the original is his general "novelization" of Plato's much sparser dialogue. Although this term most often refers to the process of turning a film into a novel, it describes quite aptly Badiou's decision to enhance the dramatic details at most implied in, but largely absent from, the presentation of the conversation that is Plato's Republic. Just as one who renders a screenplay into a novel fills in all sorts of background details, so Badiou frequently adds descriptions of the action and mood in the wider setting of the dialogue as well as indications of the feelings and motivations of the characters as they speak -- except, of course, the former has no choice but to add details in adapting a film into a book because of the difference in medium, whereas Badiou chose to add details that transform the literary genre of a Socratic dialogue into something else. And the choice in favor of these additions was made presumably because he found the original wanting in these sorts of novelistic details.

Badiou's narrative additions have, however, the odd effect of undermining the value of rational reflection and discourse championed by Plato and represented especially in the original dialogue by Socrates, who must subdue Thrasymachus and lead Glaucon and Adeimantus to a deeper understanding of the ideal nature of and typical obstacles to justice. Instead of a Socrates who has mastered both the art of dialectical reason and the passions that can inhibit it, Badiou offers a Socrates who gets carried away by his own speculative trances, or who shoots dirty looks at his interlocutors, or who is irascible, imperious, and often tired (there is a surprising amount of yawning), or who appeals pretentiously to mathematical theories simply for the effect of doing so. This "revamped" image of Socrates should be estimated alongside Badiou's updated communist ideal of justice: Socrates comes across no longer as a model of rationality whom readers and everyone else participating in the dialogue should imitate, but instead as more or less like everyone else in his inability to embody an ideal of humanity according to which reason governs spirit and appetite.

My review has focused on the philosophical implications of some central un-Platonic literary choices that Badiou makes, all in an effort to attend primarily to how form and content go hand in hand both in Plato's original and in Badiou's 's hypertranslation. Although other interpreters, especially those from Badiou's avid and extensive readership, will surely have a different, more favorable reaction to his choices of narrative techniques and literary devices, I have tried to indicate why they generally result in an unappealing picture of justice, not first and foremost as a feature of either the soul or the state, but rather as an essential feature of an ideal of discourse, where that ideal does not exclude such irrational and non-rational elements of human nature as desire and affect, or appetite and spirit, but keeps these in proper check for the sake of the potential improvement of both the soul and the state. But, while I expect that it would be shared by at least some readers, my preference for a different characterization of this ideal, in short, my preference for a different Socrates, might be beside the real point.

And here I return to what I alluded to at the outset: that the overall intent -- indeed, contribution -- of Badiou's hypertranslation might just be its strangeness, its ability to estrange us from a Socrates who is all too familiar. For, in this way, Badiou compels readers to ask themselves: "How would I rewrite the Republic for today?" and "How might Plato rewrite it for today?" And perhaps the various answers that we might give pale in comparison to the significance of the questions themselves, which we might be especially compelled to ask in the light of Badiou's funny, offensive, frustrating, thought-provoking, ridiculous, and tedious hypertranslation.

[1] Badiou, The Communist Hypothesis (Verso Books, 2010), p. 229n1.

[2] On this element Badiou’s project might be compared more fruitfully (if not more favorably) to the dialogues that C. D. C. Reeve’s  has imagined women having with each other, with Plato, and with Aristotle about some central topics in the Republic.  Cf.Women in the Academy: Dialogues on Themes from Plato's Republic (Hackett Publishing, 2001).