Plato's Republic: A Study

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Stanley Rosen, Plato's Republic: A Study, Yale University Press, 2005, 432 pp, $45.00 (Cloth), ISBN 0300109628.

Reviewed by Lloyd P. Gerson, University of Toronto


This book is Stanley Rosen's fourth study focusing on a particular Platonic dialogue. It is also by far the best. He has previously published works on Symposium (1968), Sophist (1983), and Statesman (1995). Plato's Republic is in the form of a running commentary on the entire work, along with extensive philosophical reflections on the exposition. This format will inevitably produce a certain amount of tedium in those who are familiar with the details of the Republic's argument. Yet there is hardly a passage of that work about which Rosen does not have something illuminating to say. Specialists in ancient philosophy are also likely to be irked by Rosen's decision to avoid almost entirely engagement with the secondary literature on Republic and on the interpretation of Plato generally.

Perhaps more troubling is Rosen's assumption that most of the philosophical arguments in this dialogue are intentionally fallacious. I shall address Rosen's explanation for this below. This assumption is his justification for dealing summarily with, among other things, the famous argument for the tripartitioning of the soul in book four and the separation of knowledge and belief in book five. Those familiar with the literature will be aware of the objections Rosen's raises to these arguments and also the many possible replies that have been given. Accordingly, Rosen's relatively curt dismissal of these arguments will probably only convince those who are already inclined to the view that whatever value there may be in the Platonic dialogues, it does not derive from any sound philosophical arguments to be found there.

Rosen follows the hermeneutic principle of refusing to go outside Republic to other Platonic dialogues for help in interpreting that work. This approach has an obvious appeal. It follows from the commitment to take seriously the dramatic context of the dialogue, along with the nature of the characters. Typically, the expression by an author of the intention to do this is usually not carried out to any extent. Rosen is an exception in this regard. He does give sustained attention to narrative and character and he does try to relate these to the arguments. If, however, as many scholars maintain, Republic is the culminating of and integration of arguments and claims made in earlier dialogues, it would then be a mistake not to use that material as an aid to understanding just what is going on in Plato's most complex and wide-ranging work. Rosen insists that in the dialogue Socrates always adjusts his reasoning to his interlocutors (55). This is hardly contentious. But this claim does suggest that there is a philosophical position which is in each case being adjusted. If this is so, it is difficult to see how this position—at whatever level of generality—can be derived from the dialogue itself. It is not as if Rosen eschews interpreting this general philosophical position. It is just that he apparently makes no effort to derive it from anything other than his own decades long engagement with Plato.

Rosen claims to have liberated himself from the Straussian view of Plato's Republic (5), including its "esotericism" (390). Given that the book is dedicated to "the real Leo Strauss," some will probably wish to dispute the nature and extent of Rosen's liberation. He represents the Straussian position as maintaining that "the main purpose of the Republic is to show the dangers entailed by an excessive pursuit of justice." This, says, Rosen, is a "subsidiary purpose" of the dialogue. "The main purpose is to show the impossibility of the full satisfaction of philosophical eros. This is to say that the philosopher both desires and does not desire to rule, or in other words that there is no more unity in the philosophical nature than there is in the city (81-2)." Rosen also claims that Republic is "an advertisement for philosophy (8)." This widely expressed view of the Platonic dialogues strikes me as particularly hollow, especially when it is employed as a justification for denying that there is any specific doctrinal content in the dialogues. According to Rosen, the "center" of his reading of that dialogue, he says, "lies in the recognition of a political temptation to which philosophers are destined to succumb as soon as they undertake to deviate from tradition and to reconstruct the foundations of the just city, whether in speech alone or in acts as well (10)." At the same time, Rosen recognizes that the main question raised and answered in Republic is whether it pays to be a just person. So, Rosen, like every other reader of this dialogue, has to wrestle with the fact that about one half of Republic is devoted to what can loosely be called "political" concerns. Plato was, if he chose, surely capable of answering this ethical question, along with the attendant psychological questions, without committing himself to his remarkable vision of an ideal state. Therein resides the central interpretive problem and the focus of much of Rosen's book.

As just about everyone realizes, the solution to the problem must revolve around the so-called analogy of the soul and the state. Rosen thinks that Plato's argument for dividing the soul into three is fallacious (ch. 6, passim). This does not mean that there is no utility to the analogy of the soul and the tripartite state; it only means that there is no point in speaking of the "sameness" of the two (149). According to Rosen, Plato was aware of this. The analogy "is destroyed by the simple fact that the residents of the just city have a tripartite soul as persons but a unified soul as citizens (396)." Plato nevertheless pursued the analogy because with it he could show the futility of philosophers ruling the state. For one who is philosophically just will inevitably be driven to ideology and tyranny in ruling (389). Plato, Rosen maintains, understood this (393). He uses bad arguments to convince us of the truth of this position because "there are no valid political demonstrations" or because good arguments are "politically useless, not to say harmful (394)." I take it that what this means is that Plato understood that the ideal life of philosophy is incompatible with ruling the ideal state. Rosen might have strengthened his case with a reference here to Statesman, which implicitly distinguishes the ideal ruler from the philosopher. In any case, what Rosen wants to urge is that what we might call the technical argumentative apparatus of Republic is always subordinate to Plato's efforts to convey the impossibility of uniting theory and practice.

Rosen's reason for thinking that the analogy of the soul and the state does not work is weak. Plato's argument does not depend on denying that the residents of the ideal state each have tripartite souls. It does, however, certainly depend on certain metaphysical claims about identity, sameness, and difference. As in Symposium, where Plato evidently wishes to insist that beauty can be found in bodies, soul, institutions, and laws, without denying the manifest differences among these, so in Republic he wishes to insist that justice is justice whether it be in the individual or in the state. One might usefully compare Aristotle here who also has no difficulty in speaking about justice in the individual and justice in the state itself (cf. Nicomachean Ethics, book five, chs.1-2; Politics, 1.2.1253a37 on "political justice"). The question is whether the essence of justice includes in it the "matter" of whatever is just as it would in the case (for Aristotle) of the species of sensible composites. If justice is a property uniquely of souls, then states can be said to be just only in some derivative way. Rosen is surely correct to hold that states are not just in the same way that souls are if this means simply that the "rule of reason" within one individual does not manifest itself in the same way that the rule of reason does in the ideal state. But from this it does not follow that the rule of reason is not exactly the same thing in the individual and in the state just as it does not follow from the fact that "doubleness" is variously manifested in geometry and arithmetic that "double" does not mean the same thing in each case.

Rosen will no doubt rightly insist that different manifestations of justice in the individual and in the state make all the difference in the world when we come to consider the twofold "tragedy" of rule by philosophers in an ideal state: that rule is disastrous for philosophers and for everyone else. His position, though, is diminished in plausibility by the fact that the definition of justice as "doing one's own thing" in book four and the defense of its desirability as being like that of health is separated from the characterization of philosophical justice in books eight and nine by a huge amount of famous or infamous argument in books five through eight. The defense of the superiority of justice over injustice with regard to consequences is explicitly dependent on this philosophical justice, not on the justice as defined in book four. Justice in the philosopher is manifested differently from justice in anyone or anything else. Plato, in short, seems entirely aware—and Rosen would no doubt not dispute this—that the response to the challenge of Glaucon and Adeimantus in book two cannot be fully met if we limit ourselves to justice as this is manifested in individual human beings living in any state, whether ideal or not. If Rosen is right, the analogy between the ordinary individual justice and the justice of the philosopher is just as limp as the analogy between the individual and the state. In addition, the central books of this work would not have much point, since driving home the consequences of the weakness of the analogy is Plato's main goal. If, on the other hand, Rosen is mistaken about this, then a greater focus than Rosen is prepared to allow on the central books of Republic and the details of its arguments seems justified. Plato's real tour de force is to guide his interlocutors to see that the good and bad consequences of a just life will be assessed differently by one who acknowledges that the "rule of reason" is not merely or primarily the basis for practical injunctions, but a statement about personal identity. Not surprisingly, getting to this point requires a self-transformation, inspired in part by a raft of bold argument about knowledge, belief, goodness, and so on. It also perhaps requires taking seriously the remarks in Symposium (206B), for example, that the "work (ergon)" of love of the beautiful— which is nothing but the desire for the good—is production, especially, at is best, production of virtue in the family and the state. It is not unreasonable that it is in this light that we need to understand the philosopher's reluctance to rule.

There is thus a case to be made for the claim that the passage from "ordinary" justice to the "aristocratic" justice of the philosopher is very much on Plato's agenda. If this is so, then Rosen's appropriately severe caution about the dangers of philosophers' ruling the state is merely the inevitable result of the distinction between the rational part of the soul that really is the ideal person and the embodied human being. It is just as difficult and fraught with peril for a philosophical soul to rule its own body as it is for a philosopher to rule the state.

Rosen complains that "one of the great weaknesses of the Socratic city is that it never establishes the practical value of the intuition of the pure Ideas (392)." Rosen thinks that a moment's reflection should lead us to realize that, for example, the interpretation and enforcement of law has nothing to do with the intuition of the putative Idea of law. This is a fair point. Still, the entire education of the philosopher is not simply geared to attaining that intuition, but also or primarily to a self-transformation. The philosopher who sees that "good for me" adds nothing to "good" anymore than does "true for me" adds anything to "true," is of course not thereby automatically skilled at administering justice. But having as a ruler someone who is the living embodiment of impartiality does not seem obviously worse than any of the alternatives. Nor indeed does having a ruler who is genuinely reluctant to rule, though she acknowledges ruling as the "work" naturally resulting from her possession of the good.

This is a rewarding book for specialist and non-specialist alike. Rosen takes Plato's project seriously enough to offer numerous specific criticisms of it based upon his and Plato's common humanity. He asks with obvious sincerity time and again how exactly we are to benefit from this dialogue. Surely it is a compliment to both philosophers to say that after all these years Stanley Rosen and Plato are still very much lively interlocutors.