Plato's Rivalry with Medicine: A Struggle and Its Dissolution

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Susan B. Levin, Plato's Rivalry with Medicine: A Struggle and Its Dissolution, Oxford University Press, 2014, 299pp., $65.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199919802.

Reviewed by Alex Long, University of St Andrews


In Plato's dialogues the philosopher Socrates encounters leading figures from other disciplines, such as mathematics and rhetoric. Often this leads to an intellectual contest. In a famous passage from the Republic Socrates says that there is a long-standing quarrel between poetry and philosophy (607b), although he then tries to show that the aggression lies on the side of poetry, not philosophy -- for his part, he says, he would be glad to see even the most dangerous poetry defended convincingly. These passages can give the impression that in the dialogues the function of poetry, mathematics and so on is to be the rivals of philosophy. Probably the most influential book to have taken this approach is Andrea Nightingale's Genres in Dialogue: Plato and the Construct of Philosophy (Cambridge, 1995). According to Nightingale, Plato gives philosophy a distinct voice in Athenian intellectual conversation by bringing it into relation with other, competing forms of discourse, such as poetry and oratory. The obvious attraction of this approach is that it offers a way of understanding the relationship between different disciplines or genres in Plato's writing. But if scholars expect Plato constantly to mark the boundary between philosophy and other disciplines (and from time to time to engage in a skirmish with another discipline), they risk being distracted from comparisons within a discipline, such as between different doctors or different philosophers. That risk is not altogether avoided in Susan Levin's original book on the 'rivalry' between philosophy and medicine in the dialogues.

In a previous monograph (The Ancient Quarrel between Philosophy and Poetry Revisited, Oxford, 2001) Levin has explored philosophy and poetry, or philosophy and 'literature', as she sometimes calls it, in Plato. In this new book she argues that medicine and philosophy have a similarly antagonistic relationship, at least until the Laws, where there is a rapprochement. Much of the book is structured around Levin's account of medicine in the Gorgias, Symposium, and Republic, and in the penultimate chapter she discusses the newly irenic attitude to medicine in the Laws. A second theme of the book is the doctor-patient relationship in Plato, and in the final chapter she considers what Plato has to say to contemporary bioethics. Here too the Laws provides much of the material: Levin uses the Laws to suggest how there can be asymmetry without paternalism. The third theme is politics: Levin draws connections between Plato's attitude to medicine and developments in his political philosophy. Levin obviously finds useful a developmental explanation of contrasts, and she does not say much about contemporary alternatives to 'developmentalism', as her kind of approach is now called. She defends her assumptions about the dialogues' relative dates in an early footnote (p. 5 n.1): it is quite an understatement to say that 'some controversy abides' on the subject of chronology, and non-specialists may get the false impression that scholarship is drawing ever closer to a consensus. (Levin aims to convince colleagues not only in ancient philosophy but also in bioethics and the history of medicine.)

The greatest challenge for Levin is to demonstrate a critical or hostile attitude to medicine in the Gorgias, Symposium, and Republic. As she acknowledges (p. 40), there are 'appearances to the contrary'. She provides two chapters on the Gorgias, the first of which discusses the confrontation not with medicine but with Callicles, rhetoric and sophistry, as well as the criteria for a craft or expertise (technê). (Transliterated Greek is used frequently in the book, but Levin provides at the start of the book a full glossary of Greek words.) Any specialist can see why Levin wished to put the discussion of medicine in its context, but non-specialists (and probably some students) will struggle to understand why a book on medicine and philosophy starts with the ethical theories of Callicles and Socrates. It would also have helped to offer some historical explanation of why in the fourth century it seemed quite so important to determine whether or not a profession constituted a technê. The second chapter then turns to medicine in the Gorgias, and Levin contrasts the status of medicine in that dialogue with various claims made for medicine in the Hippocratic corpus. As Levin argues, Hippocratic authors did indeed make stronger claims for medicine than Plato did. But showing this contrast, by juxtaposing passages of Plato and Hippocratic writing, does not establish that Plato was offering a critique of medicine and its authority.

In the third chapter Levin turns to Eryximachus, one of the speakers in Plato's Symposium. Not surprisingly, she suggests that his speech shows the limitations of medicine, even though Socrates directs his criticism against other speakers, Agathon and Aristophanes. In the dialogues Eryximachus is the closest thing to a representative of the medical profession, and, contrary to Levin's interpretation, there are doubts as to whether even he exactly fits that description. Eryximachus of course draws attention to his profession as a doctor, but his speech is not a narrowly medical perspective on Love. A previous speaker, Pausanias, has just distinguished between two kinds of 'love', and Eryximachus offers further applications of Pausanias' distinction, in medicine but also in agriculture, music and divination. It is hardly to Eryximachus' discredit, as Levin suggests, that he says little about virtues of the soul, for that was a central theme of Pausanias' speech, and Eryximachus is trying to show how Pausanias' distinction belongs not only to the sphere of human relations, but also to the treatment of the body and plants and to dealings with the gods. Levin is well aware of the significance of Pausanias for Eryximachus' speech, but she does not recognize that this explains the latter's reticence about moral virtues. His reticence does not, as she supposes, show that he resembles Callicles.

The discussion of medicine in the third book of the Republic is considered next. As Levin rightly observes, this is a comparatively neglected part of the Republic (philosophical scholarship tends to rush past it in order to get to the tripartition of the soul), and further treatment is very welcome. On the other hand, the contrast in this passage is not between medicine and philosophy but between different uses of medicine: roughly speaking, these are (1) treatment of injuries and the less chronic illnesses and (2) prolonging life when an illness is incurable. Levin suggests a contrast between medicine and philosophy by saying that Plato, or Socrates, comments on medicine 'qua philosopher' or 'from his standpoint as a philosopher' (pp.115, 117). This is not as innocuous as one might suppose. Socrates is speaking from a political perspective (he is teased for making the legendary doctor Asclepius too much of a politician, 407e), and the relationship between philosophy and politics has not yet come into view. Was Plato really incapable of considering a profession without considering what makes it different from philosophy?

A chapter on the Statesman makes the shift in attitude between the Republic and Laws less abrupt. Levin's account of Plato's political development is rather uneven. In the discussion of the Statesman there is a good comment (p. 150) on the variety of crafts and the interest shown in their various contributions to the city. But in the discussion of legislation adverbs do too much of the talking: 'laws do not figure significantly in the Republic' (p. 165), and yet on the other hand laws are not 'wholly irrelevant in the Republic' (p. 167). Then at last we get to the Laws, where doctors and their patients are more highly regarded: doctors are no longer subordinated to philosophers, and the doctor-patient relationship is more equal than elsewhere in Plato. I expected the chapter to focus on the discussion of medicine in Book 4 (720a-e) -- another Platonic contrast between different kinds of doctor -- but instead the chapter addresses more generally the different political ideals of the Republic and the Laws. In the closing comments on bioethics, Plato is presented as a better companion to ongoing debates than Aristotle. Levin uses Aristotle's account of phronêsis (practical wisdom) against him: according to her, the Aristotelian wise man's superiority entails that the doctor will have 'categorical supremacy' over the patient (p. 214). It is hard not to feel that a more sympathetic account of Aristotle -- or a more sympathetic application of what he says -- could be offered without very much difficulty. For one thing, why must the 'wisdom' reside in the doctor alone?

It is unfortunate that Levin does not devote a chapter to the Timaeus, as it would have encouraged her to think about philosophy and medicine in terms different from those of rivalry and reconciliation. Timaeus, the main speaker, is an authority on the body as well as the soul, and in medicine as well as philosophy. The Timaeus gives an extraordinary picture of how medicine, cosmology and psychology could inform one another. Philosophy and medicine are not rivals, and they do more than merely respect each other. Some consideration of the Timaeus would also have shown that Plato's writing about medicine is not tied to his political thought exclusively. His view of the body as an object of inquiry is important, too.