Plato's Theaetetus as a Second Apology

Placeholder book cover

Zina Giannopoulou, Plato's Theaetetus as a Second Apology, Oxford University Press, 2013, 205pp., $55.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199695294.

Reviewed by Luca Castagnoli, Durham University


In this compact monograph Zina Giannopoulou makes a case for the value of 'interweaving' Plato's Apology and Theaetetus, that is, for 'bring[ing] together the two dialogues on the basis of their thematic interconnectedness and . . . argu[ing] for a "mutually enriching reading" of them' (3). This approach clearly aspires to go beyond the uncontroversial acknowledgement of the rich intertextuality and web of philosophical resonances interconnecting virtually all the Platonic works. According to Giannopoulou, Socrates' defence speech in the Apology 'serves as the subtext which informs [Plato's] exploration of knowledge in Theaetetus' (3) and 'offers a dramatically apt and comprehensive framework that unifies the dialogue and explains many of its puzzles' (4). She describes the Theaetetus as 'a philosophically sophisticated elaboration of Apology that successfully differentiates Socrates from the sophists' by 'enacting' their distinction: it represents Socrates as a barren 'mental midwife' (2) who practises the craft of testing and discarding the sophists' inconsistent teachings about knowledge which Theaetetus unreflectively espoused. The suggestion that the Apology 'informed' the theme of the Theaetetus, and the latter is an 'elaboration' of the former, is difficult to reconcile with Giannopoulou's over-cautious disavowal of any assumption about issues of chronology and development ('the phrase "second Apology" of the title bears no chronological connotations; it is used synonymously with the phrase "another Apology" (3)). The apologetic vein running through the Theaetetus and the intertextuality with the Apology have been noticed and discussed by several scholars before Giannopoulou, and especially by Anthony Long in his 1998 article on 'Plato's Apologies and Socrates in the Theaetetus', clearly a source of inspiration for her approach. How successful her attempt is in making this the key for a novel interpretation of the Theaetetus will be judged on the basis of how systematic and effective a tool the 'interweaving' with the Apology turns out to be when reading the dialogue as a whole.

The book is divided into four main chapters, covering respectively the prologue, Theaetetus' aborted attempt to define knowledge (epistēme) by enumeration of examples, and Socrates' self-portrayal as an intellectual midwife (chapter 2); Theaetetus' definition of knowledge as perception (aisthēsis), its connection with Protagorean relativism and Heraclitean flux, and Socrates' multiple refutations of the three views (chapter 3); Theaetetus' definition of knowledge as true judgement (doxa), Socrates' examination of several puzzles concerning the possibility of false doxa, and the dismissal of Theaetetus' definition through the jury counterexample (chapter 4); Theaetetus' final proposal that knowledge is true doxa with a logos, its rejection after examination of three senses in which the addition of a logos could turn doxa into epistēme, and the dialogue's aporetic ending (chapter 5). A short conclusion summarises Giannopoulou's results, followed by a bibliography and a unified index of names and topics (no index locorum is given).

Giannopoulou's analysis of the prologue sets the tone for the rest of the book. It exemplifies the 'frequent deployment of proleptic strategies' that she describes, perhaps with some degree of overstatement, as 'the most innovative methodological feature' of her study: 'some sections look forward internally to subsequent passages, while others glance backward to earlier sections' (13). She argues that the prologue programmatically anticipates three key themes that will be broached in the main dialogue: the process of (oral or written) transmission and reception of information, and its limits as a source of knowledge; time and the importance of its continuity for the very possibility of dialectic and expertise; memory and its epistemic reliability.

The focus on the philosophical relevance of the prologue is laudable, although the identification of these themes is not new. What I found less convincing is Giannopoulou's interpretation of the significance of the proleptic hints disseminated in the prologue. For example, she takes Euclides' choice of the form of direct dialogue, and his account of the careful process by which he came to write down the conversation reported by Socrates, as Plato's ways 'to signal that the source of the written word is Socrates himself' (22). This was meant by Plato to eclipse his own role as the author, and to create an 'illusion of timelessness' (22), intimating the directness, accuracy and completeness of our access to Socrates' voice (25). But one might argue that the choice of the direct dialogue form, without the prologue's narrative framing, would have been fitter to the purpose, and that the prologue actually puts into sharp relief the problem of our complex access to the original Socrates, and perhaps the question of whether and why this problem matters. Giannopoulou does not explain why her reading of the prologue's implications should be preferable to the opposite one I have summarily sketched, nor does she ask other essential questions, such as why Plato chose the Megarians Euclides and Terpsion as the dramatis personae in the prologue. First-time readers of the Theaetetus will also find some of her 'proleptic' references difficult to grasp. This is for the most part unavoidable, as she herself warns, but some fuller and less allusive way of referring forward to later passages in the Theaetetus, and more generous cross-referencing to later sections and chapters of her book, could have helped.

Giannopoulou's attention to intertextual and background connections between the Theaetetus and the Apology in particular, and Plato's corpus as a whole, is the other declared cornerstone of her methodology. Early in the monograph we observe the risks of too cavalier a handling of this approach, when she claims that Socrates could not 'obtain a definition of knowledge from the contenders to knowledge with whom he associates', and that since 'a definitional statement of what knowledge is . . . for him is a necessary condition of knowledge' (28), 'his seemingly casual remark that so-called experts have been unable to provide a logos of knowledge is an implicit challenge to their wisdom' (29). Actually Socrates' 'casual remark' does not occur in the Theaetetus -- what Socrates says is that he is unable to define epistēme, with no indication that he has already found others equally lacking. Giannopoulou has imported and adapted into our text Socrates' claim, in the Apology, that all the (presumed) experts he has questioned have been unable to give an account of their expertise. More importantly, Socrates' 'implicit challenge' exists only if we attribute to him the assumptions, not present in the passage, or indeed in the Theaetetus, that knowledge of X requires a grasp of the definition of X, and that to have X one must know what X is (or, at least, that to have knowledge of anything one must know what knowledge itself is). These are assumptions that Socrates seems to make in other dialogues (cf., e.g., the Meno for the principle of the priority of definition, or the Charmides for the reflexivity of knowledge), but the (tacit) assumption that they are operative behind the prima facie aporetic inquiry of the Theaetetus is problematic (connectedly, Giannopoulou misdescribes the 'Socratic Fallacy of the Priority of Definition' on p. 29n25).

The section on the midwifery passage (a revised version of an article published in Oxford Studies in Ancient Philosophy in 2007) is obviously pivotal for Giannopoulou's project: 'Socrates' belief in the divine underpinnings of mental midwifery constitutes Theaetetus' answer to Meletus' charge of atheism in the Apology (54)'. Since, despite Socrates' defensive manoeuvre, Meletus' charge was not atheism, but introducing new gods in the city, readers might have liked to see her address the question of whether the Socratic god of elenchus and midwifery could have sat comfortably in the Athenian pantheon after all. She usefully emphasises some differences between the method of Socrates-the-midwife and that of Socrates-the-elenctic-questioner as depicted in Plato's early dialogues. Giannopoulou also has the merit of identifying an important question that has not received, I believe, as much attention as it deserves: why is Socrates characterised by a state of 'psychic infertility'? But her answer is not convincing: Socrates' infertility, understood as a refusal to put forward definitions and theories (e.g., concerning knowledge), results from his awareness that 'his beliefs are inferior to divine wisdom and cannot lead to knowledge' (46), an awareness famously expressed in the Apology through the admission that 'human wisdom' is worthless in comparison with divine wisdom. If this were the case, every human being should be infertile, whereas Socrates stresses the uniqueness of his divinely mandated mission, and takes for granted that (at least some of) his interlocutors are fertile, and indeed pregnant -- this is why they require the expert aid of his midwifery after all.

Chapter 3 offers a generally competent examination of that philosophical and exegetical tour de force that is 'Part I' of the Theaetetus. On the whole, Giannopoulou appears more confident when she presents specific arguments and theses, and clarifies their interconnections, than when the task is to identify and tackle broader and deeper questions which touch the very rationale of the dialogue and its unfolding. For example, while acknowledging that Protagoras' Measure Doctrine 'is not the only way of understanding' Theaetetus' definition of knowledge as perception, she claims that Protagorean epistemology is a 'plausible way of unpacking it while sharpening its focus' (56). But it is especially when we come to the discussion of 'Broad Protagoreanism', its several limits from the perspective of the Socratic enterprise, and its internal inconsistencies, that the plausibility of the initial pairing demands justification: after all, it is not perceptual relativism that threatens the possibility of Socratic dialectic and mental midwifery, or clashes pragmatically with the sophists' boasts of wisdom and teaching aspirations and practices.

The section on the 'digression' and its depiction of the philosophical ideal of godlikeness (containing revised material from articles published in 2002 and 2011) is the high point of the chapter, thanks to its nuanced attempt to explain the 'liminal position' of Socrates, and his pious midwifery mission, 'between the earthly' life of orators 'and the otherworldly realm' of the life of the 'leaders in philosophy' (98). (It should be noticed, however, that Giannopoulou's explanation of the Socratic disavowal of knowledge along the lines of a distinction between 'practical knowledge of virtues' and 'theoretical knowledge' of their definitions (100) sounds problematically un-Platonic, by implying the possibility of knowledge without theory.)

One section that I found less lucid is the discussion of the self-refutation argument against Protagoras at 170a-171c (yet another revised version of previously published material). Giannopoulou distinguishes two stages of the argument, one which 'takes place in the public world of all men' (81), and one set 'in the private worlds of Protagorean judgers' (87). The metaphor of private worlds has been widely used -- and, I believe, abused -- in the vast scholarship on the passage. But whatever we make of the merits of this metaphor, her suggestion that a large part of the argument against relativism is conducted within the public world, i.e., 'with our ordinary notion of objective reality' (81n63), would make Plato's strategy blatantly and uninterestingly question-begging. When, according to Giannopoulou, the argument finally shifts to the private relativistic worlds of Protagoras' critics (whatever this may mean), the key move made at 171b4 is Socrates' clarification that these critics will 'refuse to admit that they are wrong for themselves' when they attack Protagoras' Measure Doctrine (87). But such a refusal does not make sense, if it alludes to an objection, by Protagoras, that their anti-Protagorean view is false for them, since the Measure Doctrine does not even allow for the possibility of such an objection (that no person can ever judge something that is false for him is exactly what the Measure Doctrine guarantees). Finally, Giannopoulou's suggestion that the Measure Doctrine is falsified, by 'pragmatic self-refutation', because it is believed and advanced only by someone who is no longer a man, the ghost of the dead Protagoras (89), seems to betray some misunderstanding of the logic of pragmatic self-refutation.

At only 60 pages overall, the following two chapters provide a more focused overview of the discussion of Theaetetus' second and third definitions of epistēme. Giannopoulou's strategy in chapter 4 is to emphasise the continuity between Part I and Part II of the Theaetetus, by reading Socrates' long digression on the possibility of false judgement as 'an indirect critique of Protagoras' belief in the impossibility of false judgment' (122): 'the discovery of "what false judgment is and how it arises in us" is . . . vital for a proper demarcation of Protagorean sophistry from Socratic midwifery' (123). But of course the view that there is no false judgement had already been refuted through the self-refutation argument, and it is a question -- which she does not address sufficiently, in my opinion -- in what sense the form of radical alethic relativism under attack there, or narrower forms of perceptual relativism, were expressions of sophistic theory and 'pedagogy' anyway. She then asks whether and how the views on knowledge, belief and truth underlying Socrates' discussion of the various puzzles involving falsehood are distinctively Protagorean or sophistic. She tackles this question systematically and quite imaginatively. Although some of them are strained (e.g. the attribution of error in the 'aviary' to the knower's 'epistemic conceit' [145-146]), all her proposals, and their implications, are worth pondering. These include her association of the model of thinking as internal silent dialogue, at 189e-190a, with the process of Socratic midwifery, and her reflection on the difference between this model and Protagorean infallibilism (130-133). This is a thought-provoking proposal, although the parallelism is slightly overstated, and the qualification should be added that 'internalized midwifery' can be, at best, a regulative ideal for thought processes that properly lead to the formulation of judgements and beliefs, and not the norm. A missed occasion for Giannopoulou here lies in her failure to stress that the 'passive' and unreflective model of learning and knowledge embodied by both the waxen tablet and the aviary (149) resonates with Plato's view of sophistic pedagogy elsewhere in the corpus.

The connections drawn in chapter 5 between the complex examination of Theaetetus' definition of knowledge as 'true doxa with a logos' and Protagorean epistemology are fewer and more strained. Giannopoulou still manages to make valuable contributions on specific points (e.g., her nuanced discussion of the usually glossed-over first definition of logos at 206d-e), but it is not clear at the end what overall interpretation she endorses (let alone supports) of the function and meaning of Part III of the Theaetetus, and of the dialogue's aporetic ending. Only at the very end of the chapter does she suggest, tentatively and in no more than eight lines, that the failure of the third account of logos 'leaves the door ajar to the world of the Forms' (183): Platonic Forms, and not perceptible phenomena, are the only viable objects of knowledge and definition. But how exactly this would help to solve the several puzzles of Part III, and the dialogue as a whole, or would relate to epistemological theories explored in other relevant Platonic dialogues (including, e.g., the Meno and the Republic), is left for the reader to divine. Surprisingly, the well-worn problem of whether, in the light of this, any definition of knowledge as doxa plus something could ever be viable in a Platonic framework is not even mentioned.

This failure raises some questions concerning the overall conception of Giannopoulou's work. From a monograph on the Theaetetus, which examines, however concisely, the whole dialogue, readers will probably expect a clear line on the epistemological lessons to be drawn from the dialogue, and on at least the most central among the exegetical and philosophical puzzles springing from virtually every page. That expectation will be disappointed: although she has a number of insightful observations on specific passages and arguments, no 'big picture' appears to be in sight. One might object that her goal was not to provide a novel reading of the epistemology of the Theaetetus, but to show how the dialogue can be profitably read as a 'second Apology'. From this point of view, too, the monograph is only partially successful, however. She does manage to draw our attention to the rich intertextuality connecting the two dialogues, but in ways that do not appear to add substantially to what others, and she herself elsewhere, had already achieved. It is the promise that this approach to the dialogue would help explain many of the Theaetetus' unsolved puzzles that remains, I believe, largely unfulfilled. Clearly the representation of Socrates' method 'in action' places him in opposition to sophistic forms of teaching, here just as in many other Platonic dialogues; but whether and how such forms of teaching are connected to the Protagorean relativism as constructed by Plato, on the one hand, and to the charges of impiety and corruption of the Athenian youth, on the other, remains unclear. (Incidentally, one might object that Socrates' defence of the ideal of philosophical life in the digression could have brought grist to the mill of Socrates' accusers in the Apology, not because of any atheistic leanings, of course, but in virtue of its doubtful conformity to the religious beliefs and attitudes of Athens.)

It is probably only a slight overgeneralisation to claim that, in some way, Plato kept rethinking and rewriting Socrates' apology throughout his life. But it is only if we ask how exactly, and why, Socrates' persona, aims, methods, achievements and failures become the focus of Plato's reflection within a particular dialogical and philosophical context that this claim can transform into an effective exegetical key. Giannopoulou shows a certain tendency, however, to refrain from such higher-order questions. For example, she explains Socrates' claim that his midwifery was a 'secret' as the result of the fact that 'mental midwifery is a practice that few would understand' (38). In doing so, she does not examine the plausible alternative that this was Plato's own hint, for his readers, at the Platonic origin of the midwifery analogy (just as of Protagoras' 'Secret Doctrine'), or the implications of this possibility for our understanding of Plato's apologetic strategy in the Theaetetus.

These reservations notwithstanding, there is no doubt that Giannopoulou's monograph is a serious piece of scholarship, which will be read with some profit by students of the Theaetetus. But those who are looking for penetrating analyses of specific arguments and puzzles, or for coherent and bold reconstructions of the significance of the dialogue as a whole, whether as a foundational moment in the history of epistemology or as a key piece in the jigsaw of the Platonic corpus, will be better served by (re-)directing their attention to some of the 'classics', from Cornford to McDowell, from Burnyeat to Sedley.