Plato's Timaeus as Cultural Icon

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Reydams-Schils, Gretchen J. (ed.), Plato's Timaeus as Cultural Icon, University of Notre Dame Press, 2002, 400pp, $29.95 (pbk), ISBN 0268038724.

Reviewed by Allan Silverman , Ohio State University


Plato’s Timaeus, written in all likelihood towards the end of his career, is his contribution to the Greek tradition of writings on nature, peri phuseôs. Its introduction of a mathematical physics alone would guarantee it a significant place in the western tradition. But it is so much more than a work in cosmology and cosmogony: the Atlantis Myth; the Demiurge; the status of the likely story, eikos muthos; the relation of mind to body. Its influence on subsequent thinkers is enormous. No single volume could possibly cover all the themes broached by Plato in the dialogue, nor canvas the multitude of philosophers and scientists who have been influenced by their reading of the dialogue or translations of it. That said, Reydams-Schils Plato’s Timaeus as Cultural Icon is a paradigm of what a book of essays on the influence of a dialogue should be. First and foremost, the articles are first-rate. Moreover, they cover an extraordinary range of topics, thinkers and time-periods. What follows is an attempt to convey what each of the essays is about, so that scholars with different expertises may pick and choose as they will. But let me add that each essay is worth reading.

In `The Timaeus and the “Longer Way:” “God-Given” Method and the Constitution of Elements and Animals’, Mitchell Miller argues that the Timaeus’ account of the cosmos and the items within it works on two levels. The surface meaning is directed at those who are open to philosophical ideas or training. But at a deeper level, the Timaeus is a contribution to the longer way towards knowledge hinted at in the Phaedo and Republic. The crucial vehicle for this journey, according to Miller, is the God-given or Promethean Method of Dieresis depicted at Philebus 16c, which is then illustrated in the music and letter analogies and applied in the four-fold ontology. The Method reveals an eidetic order embodied in a variety of continua according to a formula of limit being imposed on an unlimited. Miller then shows how this Method can be used to understand the Timaean creation of the elements and the animals. Miller’s contribution is the longest, and one of the weightiest, in the collection.

The focus on the receptacle of Kenneth Sayre’s `The Multilayered Incoherence of Timaeus’ Receptacle’ dovetails nicely with Miller’s article, where the role of the most mysterious and hard to grasp new principle of the Timaeus goes largely unremarked. In contrast to Miller’s constructive and optimistic account of the metaphysics of the Timaeus and its coordination with the project of the Philebus, Sayre emphasizes the problems inherent in Plato’s depiction of the receptacle and the anomalies present in Plato’s account of the elements, their qualitative features and their relations to the mathematics of geometrical Forms. The Timaean account generates four insuperable anomalies concerning: 1) conflicting descriptions of the receptacle; 2) the status of the traces before the universe was made; 3) unaccountable relations between shape and quality; and 4) regrouping triangles and changing qualities. Indeed, Sayre concludes that `Timaeus’ receptacle was part of a failed experiment and was later abandoned for a new set of principles’, namely those provided in the Philebus.

John Dillon’s contribution begins the shift from Plato proper to the tradition. His synopsis of the readings of Speusippus and Xenocrates highlights that these first two successors of Plato, both of whom had worked with the author, adopt non-literal readings of the Timaeus: it is `for the sake of instruction’. Dillon goes on to argue, especially for Speusippus, that with the deconstruction of the creation from a previously existing chaotic state, the notion of a creator-god `goes up in smoke’. In its place we have a primal deity which is intellect, the content of which is a matrix of Forms, a world soul responsible for `transmitting’ Forms, and a receptacle, though one always informed. Effortlessly unraveling and then reweaving themes from the Timaeus, Aristotle, Speusippus and Xenocrates, to name only the principle contributors, Dillon shows how the notions of the One and The Indefinite Dyad, The Decad, Soul as Self-Moving Number, and the assignment of the proper locus of The Good to the world-soul in its executive (creative) aspect emerge from the non-literal readings of the Timaeus. His contribution is one of the highlights of the collection.

Carlos Levy’s elegant article on `Cicero and the Timaeus’ addresses the circumstances surrounding the composition of this first (for us) translation into Latin of a Platonic dialogue and its philosophical relevance. Of greater interest to the philosophically inclined is his attention to the question of how it was possible to `return to transcendence after the Hellenistic period, in which the three major philosophical systems had been elaborated without any reference to transcendental realities?’ As for its date, it is sometime after 45 B.C. (between De Natura Deorum and De Divinatione.) As for its purpose, Levy contends that it was not meant to be a stand-alone translation, a translation for its own sake, but rather was to be used in a projected dialogue on physics, a dialogue designed to show how the return to classical philosophy, i.e., Plato, would allow one to go beyond the disputes of the physicists (Lucullus) and the Hellenistic philosophers (DND and DD). In turning to the philosophical significance, Levy addresses Cicero’s handling in translation of three themes, all of which point to Cicero’s philosophical predilections towards immanence or favoring the material, human reality of this world: substituting a monologue for a dialogue; his inability to break free from the epistemological framework in considering Plato’s use of muthos—Cicero uses probabilia to describe his account of creation— and his downplaying of the nature of the demiurge; and finally his conceiving of the image/model metaphor to favor the reality of the material world, Plato’s image, over the model. Philosophers, especially those who have worried about translating a text, will be well served by reading Levy’s article.

Luc Brisson’s `Plato’s Timaeus and the Chaldean Oracles’ is devoted to showing how the essential doctrines of Plato, in the form they assumed in the Timaeus, were expressed in the context of the Chaldean Oracles, attributed to Julian the Younger in the time of Marcus Aurelius (reigned 161-80 A.D.). In the Oracles we find a Timaeus, interpreted in the light of Middle Platonism, used to `provide a context for the vicissitudes of the human soul: how once upon a time it fell into the sensible world and has to return back to its origin, above.’ As Brisson remarks, his paper addresses a way of thinking that, if strange to us, was widespread and important in late antiquity. His contribution furnishes an introduction to the way in which philosophy can be put to unfamiliar uses.

David Runia’s title aptly describes the aim of his article, to examine `Plato’s Timaeus, First Principle(s), and Creation in Philo and Early Christian Thought’. In particular, Runia explores how the status of matter is treated in these thinkers: is it, as it appears in an interpretation of the Timaeus, a first principle alongside the Demiurge/God? Or did God create the cosmos ex nihilo? His contribution takes us from the `monarchic dualism’ of Philo, Justin and Clement—where preexistent matter is a principle though not a cause—to the emergence of creation ex nihilo in Tatian, Theophilus and Irenaeus, where the preexistence of matter is denied lest God’s freedom be constrained. In a brief discussion of later views, he also raises the interesting question of how we are to understand the fact that at roughly the same time the Platonic and Christian tradition gives up on the model bequeathed by the Timaeus.

Richard Sorabji’s contribution, `The Mind-body Relation in the Wake of Plato’s Timaeus’, narrates the influence of its discussion (43a6-44c2 and 86b2-87b8) of the effects of (the) body on the movements (and nature) of the soul. These passages imply that the soul’s movements are spatial movements and allow Plato’s successors to disagree about the best way to describe the relation between mind/soul and the bodily elements. For Galen, the mental states at least follow on the blends of the hot, cold, fluid and dry, if they are not themselves blends. Alexander allows that they supervene, whereas Plotinus and the Neoplatonists insist that not all are blends. For readers interested in modern controversies in the philosophy of mind, Sorabji’s masterful summary of differing positions in antiquity will shed light on how the ancients anticipated some of the problems confronting contemporary philosophers.

In his fascinating `Aristides Quintilianus and Martianus Capella’, Stephen Gersh gives an affirmative answer to the question whether Martianus was influenced by Aristides other than in Book 9 of De Nuptiis Philologiae et Mercurii, a work of signal importance in the development of the medieval quadrivium. The bulk of the article is devoted to Aristides and four themes: the nature of music itself; the theme of the ascent and descent of the soul; the general metaphysical context in which music is to be understood; and the question of his sources. Only the first two are brought to bear in his consideration of Martianus. Music, as the science of mediations, conditions both the manner in which one understands the marriage as a fusion of music and philosophy and helps to understand the importance of ratios in Martianus’ allegory.

Paul Edward Dutton’s `Medieval Approaches to Calcidius’ is the most philological of the essays. His study of the manuscript tradition of Calcidius’ influential commentary, replete with fascinating speculations on the author, his relations to Osius and Plato’s thought, and whether or not the manuscript as we have it (ending at 53) represents all that he wrote or intended to write, will be of interest to those more inclined to textual criticism than the philosophical influence of Plato’s creation myth.

Another highlight of the collection is Cristina D’Ancona’s contribution: `The Timaeus’ Model for Creation and Providence’, subtitled `An Example of Continuity and Adaptation in Early Arabic Philosophical Literature.’ It is so rich that a brief comment cannot begin to do it justice. Her focus is on the question whether or not Avicenna manages to establish a consistency between the kind of knowledge he attributes to the necesse esse (largely a legacy of Aristotle’s prime mover) and the cura we have just encountered (largely the doctrine that God acts precisely as does the demiurge in the Timaeus). Care implies reasoning and reasoning implies weighing alternatives and choosing the best one. But according to Avicenna on divine knowledge, there is no such thing as a real change of cognitive status or weighing the alternatives. The contents of the divine mind are but the divine mind itself and the intelligible features of its effects. D’Ancona then shows how the Timaeus, or more precisely the Neoplatonic reading of it, or most precisely the Arabic paraphrases and commentaries on the Enneads, plays a decisive role in providing the Arabic philosophers with the model of a first principle that, while being so simple as to be shapeless, still possesses thought.

Michael Allen’s `The Ficinian Timaeus and Renaissance Science’ is a brief study of the influence of Ficino’s commentary on the Timaeus. Ficino is the first scholar since antiquity (besides perhaps Bessarion) with adequate knowledge of Greek to read both the Timaeus and Proclus, and thus his Timaeus is rather Neoplatonic in flavor. Ficino’s main contribution is his emphasis on the mathematical physics of the Timaeus, especially his understanding of the role the notion of mathematical proportion plays in understanding not only the construction of the physical cosmos, but also the nature of individual souls, and by extension cities, states and churches, i.e., collection of souls, as well as demons. From Allen’s essay we catch a glimpse of an approach to science and cosmology that is about to fade from history.

Rhonda Martens’ ‘A Commentary on Genesis: Plato’s Timaeus and Kepler’s Astronomy’ addresses the nature of Plato’s influence on Kepler, Koestler’s `tortured mystic’. Beginning from a discussion of his use of the five solids to depict the planetary motions, Martens shows that the significance of the Timaeus for Kepler was that he shared the idea with Plato that the creator made the world as an act of self-expression and that the material realization of the divine is the material realization of geometric patterns. The human mind, imprinted with these patterns, is able to apprehend the structure of the universe through reason. Martens’ account of how Kepler uses the Timaeus to argue for mathematical physics against the Aristotelian method of divorcing mathematics from the study of essences is especially fascinating.

The capstone to the collection of essays is Werner Beierwaltes’ study, `Plato’s Timaeus in German Idealism: Schelling and Windischmann.’ Relying in part on the Philebus, Beierwaltes examines how the young Schelling is influenced by Plato’s remarks on the limited and unlimited and the notion of ideas. “The ideas, as originative concepts in the divine understanding of the Demiurge, are then the true a priori and thus at the same time—through their expression—the origin of the . priori (the freedom from aesthesis) of human knowing, though which the knowledge can become a pure conceptual activity.” Though Schelling later came to question the authenticity of the Timaeus, provoked in part by Windischmann’s German translation, the Timaeus, and Plato, remain central to his conception of the dialectic of philosophy.

This is an excellent collection.